Moral Responsibility in Collective Contexts

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Tracy Isaacs, Moral Responsibility in Collective Contexts, Oxford University Press, 2011, 204pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199782963.

Reviewed by Matt King, St. Bonaventure University


The vast majority of philosophical literature on moral responsibility focuses on accounting for individual blameworthiness and praiseworthiness. A minority segment of the literature has focused on accounting for collective responsibility, the blameworthiness (or praiseworthiness) of groups of people acting together, wherein most of the debate concerns whether such a thing is possible. (Collectivists argue that collectives can be irreducibly responsible for things, whereas individualists argue that all can be accounted for by responsibility at the individual level.) For the most part, these two literatures have been kept separate. Tracy Isaacs' new book attempts a novel synthesis. Its aim is to provide a two-level theory that illuminates both the nature of collective responsibility as well as the nature of individual responsibility within collective contexts. The thrust of her thesis is that an individualist theory will be unsatisfying for both collective and individual levels of action and responsibility. Issacs' discussion has a number of virtues: it provides an illuminating analysis of loosely structured collectives, it highlights effectively how collective context can be a salient feature of individual action, and it extends beyond consideration of 'backward-looking' issues of moral assessment to 'forward-looking' considerations of moral obligation. And while I think that Isaacs' presentation leaves much unaccounted for, it is an interesting first step toward a full defense of her view.

Readers interested in moral responsibility and theories of agency will find it a rewarding book, despite its limitations. At less than 200 pages of discussion, the pace is brisk and the book very readable. The reader never gets lost in the arguments, which are direct and compact. But its brevity, to my mind, also signals its greatest defect. I did wish to see a more in-depth articulation of Isaacs' position and extended engagement with some of the difficulties presented. What we get instead is a cursory defense of her general view. While free of any distracting complications and thus eminently accessible, the book overall is less satisfying as a result.

Issacs divides her task into two parts. Part I of the book seeks to make space for the notion of collective responsibility. There are many who think collectives cannot be directly responsible for anything. Issacs argues that the notion of collective responsibility is actually indispensable. Her view is structured around a distinction between two types of groups. First, there are organizations, characterized by a formal structure which usually involves concrete procedures for how group decisions are made and group actions carried out. The paradigmatic example of an organization is the corporation, but organizations also include governments, universities, and professional sports teams. Organizations are noteworthy because it is easiest to disassociate the actions, decisions, and policies of organizations from those of its members.

The second kind of group Isaacs calls a "goal-oriented collective" (25). Such groups are organized not around a formal structure outlining positions and procedures within the group, but rather by coalescing "around action toward the achievement of a particular joint goal" (25). A couple taking a walk together, a study group for an exam, or hundreds performing the wave at a sporting event, all count as goal-oriented collectives. While much critical attention has been given to organizations (especially corporations), Isaacs' tackling of the more loosely structured (but arguable more prevalent) collectives provides some of the most instructive and distinctive discussion in the book. So I will spend some time outlining her claims.

While organizations require some formal structure to outline just what the organization is, simpler collectives can form simply around a loosely shared goal, say, to take a walk together, or do the wave. These actions are not possible for individuals: I cannot take a walk together on my own, I cannot play street hockey alone, I cannot do the wave alone. (34). These examples lend some credence to the thought that collectives are real, that when we go for a walk, it is the collective of us that does the walking, or at a sporting event, it is the crowd that does the wave. This collectivist view doesn't eliminate individual action. Crucial to the view is that individuals must play a role in generating the collective's intentions and action. After all, the crowd can't do the wave unless some individuals do something. So Issacs draws our attention to two important features of collective action. First, the individuals in a collective must share the goal of the collective action. This is what makes it a goal-oriented collective. This goal may be more or less well-specified. Perhaps we share the goal of making dinner together, or of playing a piece of music, or doing the wave. In each case, to be part of the collective requires sharing the collective goal: the aim of the action that requires collaboration.

Second, we must perform an intentional action ourselves. This action, however, is not the same as the collective action. Rather, what each individual in the collective does is contribute her part to the collective action (39). This might be chopping the vegetables, or playing the clarinet portion, or standing up and raising my arms at the appropriate time. When we do this, while sharing the goal, and when the rest of the group also shares the goal, then we've performed a collective action together. (This simplifies Isaacs' view somewhat. She has a very interesting discussion about the knowledge requirements on each member of the collective as well as degrees of 'tightness' that collectives can exhibit [41-51]. I set these aside for reasons of space.)

Both organizations and goal-oriented collectives can count as collective agents who can be responsible for performing collective actions, according to Isaacs. Her defense of this claim is two-fold. First, the action theoretic reason for responsibility at the collective level is that some actions can only be performed by collectives, but these actions nonetheless have moral character. It follows that they are the sort of thing on the basis of which an agent can be morally evaluated. Thus, the agents of collective actions can be morally responsible for those actions. Isaacs gives us the example of running in a race to raise money for cancer research. Say this particular race raises two million dollars, and let us assume that this is morally laudable. But no person raised that money. All the runners raised it collectively. So they are to be praised, as a collective, for raising that money. So collective action with moral character is best explained by collective responsibility.

The second reason is normative. Issacs notes that we lose something of normative significance if we ignore moral evaluation at the collective level. To return to the fundraising race, suppose Jones raises $200 as part of his effort in the race. This is laudable. But it does Jones a disservice to suppose that this is all he contributes. Rather, he also does his part in raising two hundred million dollars for cancer research. Without responsibility at the collective level, we can't properly understand the moral significance of Jones' individual action. Indeed, Issacs argues, the collective action is more fundamental than the individual action, such that "individuals' contributions . . . inherit relevant moral features from the collective action context in which they occur," rather than the other way around (57). Similarly, to use one of Isaacs' examples, perpetrators of genocide do morally atrocious deeds. But their acts are only properly evaluable within the context of a wider collective context, whereby their individual killings contribute to the genocide. It is the moral horror of genocide, evaluable as a collective wrongdoing, which informs our assessment of particular killings done by individuals. Again, the collective action and its moral weight are more fundamental than the individual contributions. While I remain unconvinced, I nevertheless found Isaacs' collectivist arguments compelling, especially against the backdrop of more individualistic views and critiques.

Part II of the book changes tack somewhat, and is more diverse in purpose. Chapter 4 addresses the concern that if collectives are blameworthy for collective wrongdoing, then individual members can escape responsibility. Chapter 5 discusses the related notions of individual and collective obligation, especially in the context of essentially collective problems, like climate change. And Chapter 6 looks to the role of the individual in wrongful social practices, where the collective is neither an organization nor a goal-oriented collective, such as cases of endemic racism or ignoring the plight of the poor. These chapters are unified only as discussions of disparate concerns that arise in the face of Isaacs' two-level view. She argues convincingly, I think, that her view does not entail the absence of individual responsibility in collective wrongdoing. Her treatment of collective obligation is refreshing; rare is it to see the backward and forward looking notions of responsibility explicitly drawn together. And her discussion of wrongful social practices is seldom an element of careful thought about responsibility. These chapters demonstrate the fruitfulness of considering collective contexts in their own right, exposing one of the chief merits of the book's project.

Isaacs does a commendable job of indicating just how her position is related to others' work on collective responsibility, as well as directly handling a substantial number of objections to her position. My main objection is really a cluster of concerns that all stem from a worry about collective agents as (metaphysically) real. One way to express this worry is to look at agents apart from particular actions they perform. Most humans count as agents and can perform a range of actions. But they exist as agents in part separate from any particular action they might perform. Similarly, highly-structured collectives, like organizations, have the structure in place to be easily identified apart from any actions performed. A government or sports team is what it is independent of the various actions it might perform.

But the same sort of identification does not seem possible for goal-oriented collectives. We cannot identify the collective agent of the wave at a sporting event independently of the event of the wave. This collective agent is not the same as the crowd, for not all members need to have participated. Rather, some collective event exists and determines the collective agent: it is the group that performed it. This seems to imply, however, that the collective agent has little reality apart from the collective action in question. Indeed, it makes no sense to ask, what did the collective agent do after the wave? Or before? If these timeframes do not include anyone sharing the goal of performing the wave, then there is no goal-oriented collective. We can of course talk about the group consisting of the members of the collective that did the wave, but they are no longer bound by sharing that goal, and so seem no more than an artifact of a passing event.

This skepticism about the metaphysical reality of goal-oriented collectives might not be troubling in and of itself, but I think it raises some puzzling issues about how to proceed on Isaacs' view. For instance, how are we to blame goal-oriented collectives, especially after the members have given up the relevant goal? Take the Rwandan genocide, an example Isaacs employs often. On her view, it is an instance of collective wrongdoing. So the collective agent is blameworthy. But just who should our attitudes target? The collective agent just is the perpetrator of the genocide. This is, presumably, some group of Hutus. And to blame the collective must be different from blaming any particular Hutu, on Isaacs' view, for each Hutu is only responsible for his or her contribution to the genocide, not for the genocide itself. Moreover, Isaacs is at pains to argue that collective assessment is not distributive; that is, the fact that a collective is blameworthy for some wrong does not distribute across the individual members of the group (81-83).

So suppose we have the relevant group in our moral sights, some set of Hutus who all contributed to the goal-oriented collective action of genocide against the Tutsis. And suppose we blame the collective agent of this genocide. So, it seems we blame the group for committing genocide. But after the collective action, especially if the goal has been given up, we may no longer have that collective agent. So it is entirely unclear just who we can target with our blame. Put another way, while we may be able to target a group whose members were members of that collective agent, the agent itself may have disappeared. We can, of course, still blame each individual for their contribution to the genocide, but we may be able to do no better in blaming the collective agent than we can blame individuals who no longer exist. And even if it is possible to, say, blame my dead relative for his transgressions toward me in the past, the nature of this blame surely seems different that what I can feel toward existing persons.

A related concern attends Issacs' discussion of collective obligations. She argues that there are problems that require collective solutions, like climate change, and that this suggests that the collective agents who are to work toward these solutions may have collective obligations. But many problems that require a collective solution exist prior to any collective that shares a goal of solving it. To take a contrived example (but one similar to Isaacs'), suppose a boating family has capsized and is having difficulty in the water. No individual can manage a rescue himself; rather it will take a group of at least four. Issacs claims that what we have here is a putative group with a putative obligation (144-55). The family needs saving and we are obligated to do so. Just who is the 'we'? Well, it's the group that ought to save the family. This is a collective problem requiring a collective solution, and the obligation is held by the collective agent who is to perform the collective action of rescuing the family.

The difficulty here, however, as above, is that there seems to be no collective agent to have said obligation. Now we might say that I have an individual obligation to form such a collective, or to do my part to save the family, but these are individual obligations, ones I might plausibly have whatever our view about collective responsibility is. And it seems odd to suppose that there can be an obligation had by a group that doesn't exist. Moreover, even if there is a shared obligation among all the onlookers to form a collective so as to rescue the family, it still can't be an obligation the collective agent has, for there is still no collective agent involved. Indeed, as my comments revealed above, there is no collective agent apart from whoever rescues the family (or attempts to). But since this can't be settled prospectively, talk of prospective obligations appears to put the normative cart before the metaphysical horse.

I mean none of the above to be a decisive critique of Isaacs' view. Rather, I think these worries are evidence of both the novelty and suggestiveness of her position. I do find myself in disagreement with much of what she argues, and I think there are substantive issues that remain unaddressed in the book. But this is relatively small criticism in the face of what the book does achieve: smart and accessible discussion of an insightful and suggestive argument of the importance of collective contexts to moral responsibility. That it raises concerns and questions speaks to its relevance to all those interested in matters of agency and moral assessment.