Moral Skepticism: New Essays

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Diego E. Machuca (ed.), Moral Skepticism: New Essays, Routledge, 2018, 243pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138645868.

Reviewed by Matt Lutz, Wuhan University


This book, edited by Diego Machuca, is a wonderful collection of essays related to moral skepticism. 'Moral skepticism' is understood broadly, with discussions of both epistemic moral skepticism (the view that moral knowledge or justified moral belief is impossible, or else the higher-order "Pyrrhonian" view that we cannot know if justified moral belief is possible) and ontological moral skepticism (including both moral error theory and moral non-cognitivism). The essays are of a very high quality, written by a who's-who of philosophers doing exciting contemporary work in metaethics. They summarize the current state of the literature on moral skepticism and push that literature forward along many fronts. The collection is too advanced to be suitable for use in undergraduate courses. But any researcher interested in skeptical themes in metaethics will find this an invaluable resource. In this review, I'll summarize the main arguments of each of the essays, offering brief critical comments from the perspective of someone attracted to both epistemic and error-theoretic skepticism.

Hallvard Lillehammer is a constructivist who holds that moral facts concern facts about what norms we can accept in a state of reflective equilibrium. His main goal in "Projection, Indeterminacy and Moral Skepticism" is to demonstrate that constructivists can account for the fact that we seem to be talking and thinking about objective matters of fact when we engage in moral discourse. Lillehammer's response to this challenge is to say that our moral thought is subject to two kinds of errors: "errors of projection" and "errors of determinacy." The former arise when we project our attitudes onto the world by (e.g.) taking others to share our moral attitudes when in fact they do not. The latter arise when we think that a question has one determinate answer but, in fact, there are many equally good answers. Errors of determinacy are Lillehammer's main interest. Because there are many sets of norms that could be accepted in reflective equilibrium, we are simply in error if we think that moral questions have determinate answers. And, Lillehammer argues, errors of projection can explain errors of determinacy. By projecting our own attitudes onto others, we fail to realize that other points of view are reasonable.

This is a nice paper, but the central move seems somewhat undermotivated. Moral realists (and error theorists) do not deny that different sets of norms could survive reflective equilibrium; they hold that it is a conceptual truth that morality is universal and not grounded in our contingent attitudes. According to Lillehammer, this is an error. But he gives us little reason for this claim other than the fact that constructivism entails jt.

Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons ("The Phenomenology of Moral Authority") are also concerned with how non-error-theoretic anti-realists can explain aspects of our moral thought. Their essay discusses an argument from Jean Hampton that a certain aspect of our phenomenology -- the authoritativeness of moral norms -- gives us strong reason to accept moral non-naturalism. According to Hampton, moral non-naturalism is the only way to accommodate this authoritativeness. Horgan and Timmons disagree.

For Horgan and Timmons, as expressivists, our moral judgments are projections of a kind of desire-like mental state. Importantly, this is a projection of a kind of desire-like mental state. Sentiments come in many different forms. The way in which one desires ice cream is different from the way in which one desires sex, and the way in which one desires that others be helped is different from these other two kinds of desires. The phenomenological difference between these desires is obvious. And it is the key to understanding "authoritativeness;" Horgan and Timmons argue that the various features of moral thought that, for Hampton, constitute authoritativeness, are precisely what distinguish moral appraisals from other kinds of desire-like states.

They are correct to say that the expressivist can answer Hampton's argument. But their further contention that expressivism has a substantial advantage over error theory is more doubtful. Error theorists may fully agree with all of Horgan and Timmons's points about the nature of moral thought and ontology. Both hold that our moral judgments are governed by desire-like attitudes of moral approbation and disapprobation, which we "project" onto the world. But error theorists hold that this projection leads us to form false beliefs about in-the-world moral properties, whereas expressivists hold that we do not form moral beliefs that are distinct from our desire-like attitudes. So, what reason do we have to prefer expressivism to error theory?

Horgan and Timmons offer two reasons. First, they submit that moral error theory entails that people are massively in error in their moral discourse, and that's a strong reason to reject error theory. I do not see why this is so. Compare: If God does not exist, that would entail massive error in the theological discourse and practice of most people. Atheists would rightly wonder why this fact provides any reason to think that atheism is misguided. Horgan and Timmons' second argument against error theory is that error theorists must provide some way of vindicating our use of moral discourse and practice even while they are committed to the non-existence of moral facts, or else reject the use of moral discourse and practice altogether, which amounts to "throwing out the baby with the bathwater." But is this really the choice that error theorists face?

In "Moral Skepticism, Fictionalism, and Insulation", Diego Machuca takes up the question of whether skepticism (either error-theoretic or epistemological) can force us to throw out the baby with the bathwater and give up our first-order moral commitments. Abolitionists say yes. Insulators say no. After surveying different kinds of insulation, Machuca worries that the view is incoherent. It seems straightforwardly contradictory to both hold the higher-order belief that there are no substantive moral truths and to believe particular first-order truths. Calling one belief "higher-order" and the other "first-order" doesn't remove this incoherence.

Machuca levels this charge, in particular, against Jonas Olson's conservationism, which says that error theorists should hold onto their first-order moral beliefs by "compartmentalizing" them. Machuca worries that Olson's need for compartmentalization just highlights the incoherence of conservationism.

But the same worries do not to apply to Richard Joyce's revolutionary fictionalism. A revolutionary fictionalist like Joyce does away with moral beliefs, and adopts an "as if" attitude toward morality instead. Machuca says that this means that fictionalism is not a kind of "doxastic insulation" because moral beliefs are abandoned, and it is doxastic insulation that is his primary concern. But why this restriction to doxastic insulation? Joyce argues extensively against abolitionism on the grounds that moral discourse is valuable for many of our human enterprises. Thus, if we understand insulation as signifying only doxastic insulation (i.e. Olson's conservationism), then it is wrong to draw a dichotomy between insulation and abolition. Fictionalism remains a live option.

So, too, does the view espoused by John Mackie. As Machuca shows through some nice exegesis, Mackie holds that we should reinterpret our moral beliefs as mere subjective attitudes, thereby avoiding concerns of logical incoherence: it is not incoherent to hold beliefs about one's own subjective attitudes while disbelieving in objective moral facts. This makes Mackie's view a kind of revolutionary subjectivism (although Machuca does not use this term). Revolutionary expressivism is also a live view in this area.

Revolutionary positions are popular among error theorists, because they seem to avoid the "baby with the bathwater" flaws of abolitionism and the incoherence worries of conservationism. Thus, there is, apparently, a family of insulating positions that are immune to the concerns of both Machuca and Horgan and Timmons.

Christine Tiefensee ("Error Theory, Relaxation and Inferentialism") assumes a "relaxed" conception of moral ontology, according to which questions of the existence of moral facts are not metaphysical in any robust sense, but simply ways of asking questions about our first-order moral commitments. If we "relax" our ontology, we must interpret the error theorist's claim that nothing is morally wrong as a first-order commitment to the permissibility of all actions. As we've seen, that's not something that many error theorists would want to accept.

Nonetheless, Tiefensee argues that even if we accept a relaxed ontology, it is possible to come up with a version of error theory based entirely on the idea that moral concepts are incoherent. By adopting "inferential role" semantics, Tiefensee shows that there are ways for the error theorist to claim that there is no coherent inferential role for moral concepts to satisfy. This is a way for someone to be an error theorist while still accepting deflationary ontology.

Tiefensee provides a fascinating discussion of an under-explored area of logical space, but hers is not likely to be a particularly friendly suggestion to error theorists. Her version of error theory doesn't capture the thoughts that motivate traditional error theory. Inferential role semantics works much better with expressivism than with error theory, and relaxed ontology works much better with non-naturalist realism. So, while the view that Tiefensee develops is coherent, she is not particularly sympathetic to it, and I doubt that many others will be.

Bart Streumer is well-known for his argument that we can't believe normative error theory. His  essay ("Why We Really Cannot Believe the Error Theory") consists almost entirely in responses to objections to his argument offered recently by various authors. Streumer's arguments are, as always, clever and stimulating, although for reasons of length I won't explore the many moves and counter-moves in detail. The paper is a good contribution to the debate over whether we can believe normative error theory. But because it occurs a few steps deep in the dialectic, readers interested in this question should begin with Streumer's other works on this subject.

We turn our attention now towards essays that are more concerned with epistemic moral skepticism. Diego Machuca's introductory chapter does an excellent job of surveying the current landscape of arguments for skepticism, and contains a very useful observation: most contemporary skeptical arguments appeal, at one point or another, to the notion of the best explanation. Accordingly, many of the arguments that Machuca and others survey are concerned with the relationship between best explanations and skepticism.

In "Arguments from Moral Disagreement to Moral Skepticism", Richard Joyce is concerned with the question of whether arguments from disagreement really do support a skeptical conclusion in ethics. According to a famous argument by Mackie, the best explanation of moral disagreement is that our moral attitudes are the products of social conditioning. But so what? Why should we prefer "our attitudes are the product of social constructions and there are no moral facts" to "our attitudes are the product of social constructions and there are moral facts?" The skeptical conclusion seems unsupported.

The obvious move to make is to appeal to parsimony -- we should prefer a simpler ontology, which includes no moral facts. But this line of thought can be resisted in two ways. First, naturalists may reply that moral facts do play an explanatory role. Second, realists may say that moral facts are more like planets orbiting Betelgeuse than like unicorns. We have no evidence one way or the other for either of these things, but it is appropriate to be agnostic about planets orbiting distant stars, and anti-realists about unicorns. The difference seems to be that, in the case of unicorns, if they did exist, then we would have evidence of them. But in the case of planets, we shouldn't expect to have evidence one way or the other regarding them. And maybe we shouldn't expect to have evidence one way or the other regarding moral facts. This would make agnosticism, rather than error theory, the appropriate attitude to take toward morality.

Joyce offers two possible paths forward for the skeptic. One is to say that moral disagreement is a kind of "peer disagreement," and argue that the appropriate response to peer disagreement is epistemic skepticism. This response faces difficulties because it is very difficult to assess who is your peer on moral matters. The other path is to offer a genealogical debunking argument, which attempts to debunk our moral beliefs by showing that they are the product of natural processes. But this seems like a better objection to moral non-naturalism than moral realism more generally, and thus does not (by itself) support a strong skeptical conclusion.

Folke Tersman's "Moral Skepticism and the Benacerraf Challenge" traces the development of one of the most interesting issues in moral epistemology today, the moral Benacerraf Challenge. The Benacerraf Challenge was originally formulated as a challenge to the possibility of mathematical knowledge for mathematical Platonists, first by Paul Benacerraf and later by Hartry Field. The central question, on Field's formulation, is how can we explain the reliability of our mathematical beliefs. In recent years, it has been adapted as a challenge to the possibility of moral knowledge for moral non-naturalists; how can the reliability of our moral beliefs be explained? This is often framed as a way of understanding the force of genealogical debunking arguments.

Non-naturalists have risen to meet this challenge, with both Justin Clarke-Doane and David Enoch offering influential avenues of response to the moral Benacerraf Challenge. Tersman spells out the steps in this dialectic, concluding (provisionally) that Enoch and Clarke-Doane have been able to answer the challenge. But it would be premature to call this a decisive victory; at most, the burden has been shifted to the skeptic to articulate a version of the challenge that Enoch and Clarke-Doane cannot answer.

In "Evolutionary Debunking, Realism and Anthropocentric Metasemantics",
Mark Van Roojen (like Joyce) argues that moral naturalists can avoid genealogical debunking arguments -- particularly evolutionary debunking arguments -- by accepting a causal theory of reference according to which our moral terms refer to the homeostatic cluster properties that causally regulate our use of those terms. This causal referential relationship is also epistemic; if it is true, then we can come to know moral facts by investigating the causes of our use of moral terms.

This helps the naturalist answer the evolutionary debunking challenge. The way that we evolved is contingent; we might well have evolved so that our use of moral terms would track different properties. But in that case, our moral terms would mean different things. So it is a necessary metasemantic fact that our use of moral terms -- and, accordingly, our moral judgments -- will track the moral truth, and thus be at least approximately reliable.

One might object to the appeal to causal reference theory by citing Horgan and Timmons's famous "Moral Twin Earth" (MTE) argument. But van Roojen does not find MTE counter-examples to externalist metasemantics for moral terms very compelling. And even if MTE did show that the Cornell realist's metasemantics are hopeless, it would be MTE -- not the evolutionary debunking argument -- that makes troubles for naturalism.

Between Joyce and van Roojen, we can see that naturalists have many resources at their disposal for answering extant skeptical challenges. And Tersman provides hope that non-naturalists can answer a prominent skeptical challenge, as well. Skeptics need to sharpen their arguments.

David Copp ("Are There Substantive Moral Conceptual Truths?") attacks a recent paper by Terence Cuneo and Russ Shafer-Landau that attempts to provide a non-naturalist-friendly response to skeptical arguments by holding that there are substantive moral conceptual truths, which Cuneo and Shafer-Landau call "Moral Fixed Points." While it may seem implausible that there are substantive moral conceptual truths, Cuneo and Shafer-Landau substantiate their position by offering a particular view of concepts -- that concepts are abstract identities that exist somewhere in Plato's or Frege's Heaven, and that conceptual truths concern the relations between these abstracta. We come to know these truths when we "grasp" the relevant concepts.

Copp replies that this is an implausible view of concepts, particularly because it seems to raise all of the same epistemic problems that motivate moral skepticism about non-natural moral facts. How can we have epistemic access to abstract concepts; what is this "grasping" relation? If concepts are abstract, how can the reliability of our beliefs in conceptual truths be explained? If our beliefs in conceptual truths are true, how can this be anything other than a coincidence? Copp surveys a number of moves that Cuneo and Shafer-Landau could make in response, and finds problems will all of them. To my eye, this is a devastating takedown of the Moral Fixed Points position. I'm interested to see how Cuneo and Shafer-Landau will respond.

We come last to Aaron Zimmerman's "Veneer Theory", which provides a historical perspective on skepticism. Zimmermann's interest is in "veneer theory," the favored moral theory of "Darwin's Bulldog," T.H. Huxley. Veneer theory was recently and influentially attacked by the biologist Frans de Waal. On de Waal's telling, Huxley's "veneer theory" amounts to the claim that all of morality is a kind of hypocritical posturing. Our true motives are to seek out our own good, amorally or even immorally, because this is what evolution selected for us to do. To the extent that we ever engage in moral discourse, it is to deceptively urge others to act for our own benefit. De Waal musters substantial psychological evidence to show that this theory is false.

Zimmerman argues convincingly that de Waal has misunderstood Huxley, and that Huxley's thesis is more plausible than de Waal makes it out to be. Huxley did not think that humans act only in self-interest, but instead in the interest of their groups. As social creatures, we form groups in order to better compete with other groups; that is our evolved human nature. Thus, we have a tendency for altruism towards those that we consider to be "on our side," but it is matched by hostility for those who are not on our side. And there's always some group that's not on our side. The "veneer," for Huxley, is the egalitarian, cosmopolitan pretension that our moral sense applies equally to all. In reality, there are always outsiders that we don't give a damn about.

Despite the historical cast of this discussion, Zimmermann's version of Huxley's veneer theory deserves to be taken seriously. The fact that hostility toward the outgroup or toward "the other" does seem to be an ineliminable aspect of human psychology deserves more attention than it has been given.

I regret that I cannot discuss these essays in more detail. But I hope it is clear that there is much of value in this collection. I recommend it strongly.