Moral Skepticisms

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Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, Moral Skepticisms, Oxford University Press, 2006, 288pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0195187725.

Reviewed by Peter J. Graham, UC Riverside


Christendom, an expert on the topic lamented on CBC the other night, is in decline in the West. Apparently "Modernity" is to blame. The Pope probably agrees. Though I'm not sure what Modernity includes, the advancement of science, technology, literacy, higher education; the greater awareness for cultural diversity; the greater appreciation of the value of tolerance; and so on, are probably all a part of the overall package. And these things might all lead to a decline in Christendom because Christendom thrives on a lack of awareness or understanding of how science reveals the nature of things and how technology works; lower rates of literacy and higher education; a lack of appreciation for cultural and religious diversity; and a certain degree of intolerance of difference. "Modernity" may make its citizens more aware of alternative explanations of religious belief, explanations that don't require the positing of an all-powerful, all-knowing, all-good, all-present, creator and sustainer of all things who acted in the world through his one and only Son in order to save us all from our sins. Perhaps religious belief is simply due to culture and upbringing, or evolution, or driven by various psychological needs, or something else altogether. "Reason" no longer seems to assist "Faith" the way it once did.

Will Morality suffer the same fate? As our knowledge advances, will our belief in the existence of real moral values, of right and wrong as real properties of acts, fall to the wayside? The Moral Realist says no; the Moral Nihilist says yes. Both the Realist and the Nihilist are "cognitivists" about moral discourse. When we say that something is morally wrong (torturing prisoners for information) or morally permitted (interracial marriage) we are purporting to say something true, and what we say is either true or false depending upon how things really are in the world. For what we say to be true, moral rightness and moral wrongness must be real properties -- properties "in the world" -- of acts. Traditional Theists are cognitivists too. They think "God exists" not only purports to be true, but also is true. Traditional Atheists, though they agree "God exists" purports to be true, think it is actually false. The Moral Realist is thus like the Theist; there really are moral properties or moral "facts" in the world. The Moral Nihilist is like the Atheist; though our moral discourse is "cognitivist", in fact there are no moral properties in the world; our moral claims are all, give or take a few important qualifications, false.

And so, to return to our question, will Morality suffer, or should it suffer, the same fate as Christendom in the West? As our knowledge (scientific, cultural, technological, and philosophical) advances, should we find Realism about moral properties and facts less and less attractive? Should we find good alternative explanations for moral beliefs, explanations that don't depend, in any way, on there being moral properties or moral facts? Presented with prima facie good arguments from sophisticated Moral Nihilists that exploit our background knowledge, knowledge that we possess as citizens of Modernity, should we at least suspend judgment about the existence of moral facts? And as cognitivists about moral discourse, should we then at least suspend judgment about whether this or that act is right, whether this or that act is wrong? Should we, like many raised as Christians in the West who, in their heart of hearts, aren't really believers, suspend judgment about the truth of the Christian religion? Presented with good arguments, arguments we don't see how we might possibly answer, are we at least rationally compelled to take a skeptical -- agnostic -- stance on the truth of our moral beliefs? Presented with these arguments, are we rationally compelled to abandon our moral beliefs? Should we even convert to Moral Nihilism?

In his book Moral Skepticisms, Walter Sinnott-Armstrong argues, among other things, that the cognitivist about moral discourse is right on the mark, and that the Moral Nihilist has some pretty good arguments for her conclusion, arguments that, though they do not rationally establish their conclusions, do nevertheless withstand standard rebuttals. So, he concludes, there is a good, but not conclusive, case for Moral Nihilism. Perhaps "agnosticism" about moral facts, given the present state of the debate, is our best response. But he doesn't think we are rationally compelled to abandon our moral beliefs in light of these arguments; he gives a negative answer to our question: are we rationally compelled to abandon our moral beliefs? Even if the Nihilist's arguments are good ones, arguments you might find good enough to warrant suspension of belief in moral facts when you consider them carefully, they don't rationally compel you to give up your moral beliefs. Your moral beliefs can be epistemically justified -- justified in a way that has to do with good evidence or grounds for believing true -- even if you can't answer really good "defeaters" for your beliefs. Or so Sinnott-Armstrong argues. This might strike one as a surprising claim. Indeed, it strikes me as rather problematic. Shouldn't we either answer the Moral Nihilist, or give up on our moral discourse, at least construed "realistically," as purporting to state truths about the world? Just as the Theist is in epistemic deep water given the more we know about the world and the source of religious belief, so too the Moral Realist faces a real challenge from the Moral Nihilist. Indeed, one version of Moral Realism -- divine command morality -- goes out the window if the Atheist is right. So how does Sinnott-Armstrong think he can "insulate" moral beliefs from the arguments of the Moral Nihilist?

It all has to do with contrast classes, relevance, and skepticism about relevance. So first I'll talk about contrast classes and relevance, then skepticism about relevance, and then say how Sinnott-Armstrong puts all this together in his attempt to "insulate" moral belief from Moral Nihilism.

Take a look out your window. You might just see a bird. Can you tell what kind it is? Maybe you think it's a goldfinch by its yellow head. But canaries also look like that. Does your perceptual experience and background knowledge provide enough information to "rule out" the possibility that it's a canary? If it does, then your belief that it is a goldfinch is justified out of the contrast class {canary, goldfinch}. Does your evidence also rule out the possibility that it is a rare species of parrot? If it also does that, then your belief is also justified out of the contrast class {canary, goldfinch, rare parrot}, a relatively "modest" class of alternatives. What about the possibility that it is just a stuffed animal, a replica of a canary? Or a robot canary? Or a delusion due to overheating of the brain? Suppose your evidence does not rule out those possibilities. Then your belief that it is a canary is not justified out of the contrast classes {canary, goldfinch, stuffed animal}, {canary, goldfinch, robot}, or {canary, goldfinch, delusion}. Or what about the "extreme" contrast class, which includes the possibility that you are a massively deceived, disembodied brain-in-a-vat? If we include that possibility in a contrast class involving canary, then it's highly likely (given the history of epistemology) that you won't have any non-question-begging way of ruling out that possibility. So out of the "extreme" contrast class {canary, goldfinch, BIV}, you are not justified in believing that a canary is over yonder.  This is Sinnott-Armstrong's first main "technical" idea, that we can describe beliefs as justified or not relative to contrast classes, especially "modest" ones where our everyday beliefs turn out justified, and "extreme" ones where our everyday beliefs all turn out unjustified. Given your evidence and background beliefs, and given a contrast class, we can say whether your belief is justified relative to that class.

This idea obviously applies equally well to moral beliefs. Here is Sinnott-Armstrong's example. Consider Candice, who has cancer. She has little time to live, and what is left will be full of pain. She asks her doctor to kill her now, and refuses to discuss other options. Her doctor takes up her request with the hospital ethics committee. It's up to them to decide the morally right thing to do. Here are some of their options: active euthanasia (AE), keeping her alive as long as possible while relieving pain (KA), just give her food and water while relieving pain (FW), and withdraw all life support while relieving pain (WA). Out of the contrast class {AE, KA, FW, WA}, what are they justified in believing is the right option? Well suppose the ethics committee, though they have no good, non-question-begging reason to reject active euthanasia, simply do reject it. "Killing patients," they say, "is simply morally abhorrent; case closed." Then, Sinnott-Armstrong thinks, the committee members would not be justified in believing one of the alternatives out of the contrast class {AE, KA, FW, WA}. They dismiss AE without evidence, an entirely question-begging maneuver; hence they are not justified in rejecting it insofar as it is a member of the contrast class. Their belief that FW (suppose) is correct may be justified relative to one (the smaller, more modest) contrast class, without being justified relative to another (the less modest contrast class).

But suppose AE is not a "relevant" alternative; suppose that it is not an alternative for which the members of the committee need non-question-begging evidence (or any evidence, for that matter) to rule it out as immoral in order to be really justified or justified without qualification in believing some other course of action is the morally right one. So just as we are now familiar with the idea that you don't have to rule out the possibility that you are a massively deceived disembodied brain in a vat (especially when you have absolutely no reason to think that might in fact occur) -- that possibility is not a "relevant" one -- so too ethics committees (and everyone else making moral decisions) get to ignore or dismiss certain alternative possibilities as irrelevant. In that case, though you are not justified in believing that there is a canary perched atop the tree out of the "extreme" contrast class {canary, goldfinch, BIV}, you are justified out of the "relevant" more "modest" contrast class {canary, goldfinch}. Likewise, if AE is not a "relevant" alternative, though the committee is not justified in believing one of the alternatives in the less "modest" contrast class {AE, KA, FW, WA}, it may for all that be justified in believing one of the alternatives out of the "relevant" more "modest" contrast class {KA, FW, WA}.

And here is where Moral Nihilism comes into the picture. Ethics committees not only sometimes "dismiss" as "irrelevant" active euthanasia, they always (nearly always?) dismiss as irrelevant Moral Nihilism, the possibility that absolutely nothing is really right or wrong. Out of the "modest" contrast class {KA, FW, WA} the committee might be justified in believing one option to be the right one, but out of the "extreme" contrast class {KA, FW, WA, Moral Nihilism}, the committee is not justified in believing any of the options, for they cannot (as Sinnott-Armstrong argues at length in the later chapters of the book) non-question-beggingly dispatch of Moral Nihilism. Once Moral Nihilism is in play, none of our evidence or background information can "rule it out" without begging the question. So if we are to have any justified moral beliefs, Moral Nihilism, like the possibility that you are a massively deceived disembodied brain-in-a-vat, must be an "irrelevant" alternative possibility.

Is Moral Nihilism a relevant possibility? The Academic Moral Skeptic says yes. The Academic thinks Nihilism is relevant, hence for any moral belief to be really justified, we must be able to "rule out" Moral Nihilism in a non-question-begging way, and that is precisely something we cannot do. The "relevant" contrast class, according to the Academic Moral Skeptic, is the "extreme" contrast class. The non-Skeptic, on the other hand, thinks Moral Nihilism is not a relevant possibility. Though we cannot rule out Moral Nihilism in a non-question-begging way, we don't have to. The "relevant" contrast class, the non-Skeptic says, is a much more "modest" class than the "extreme" class. So the Academic Skeptic thinks our moral beliefs are not justified without qualification; they are not justified out of the relevant contrast class (the extreme one). But the non-Skeptic thinks they are justified without qualification; they are justified out of the relevant contrast class (a more modest one).

So whether our inability to rebut the seemingly good, or at least challenging, arguments for Moral Nihilism, and whether that means Morality should decline in the West (and elsewhere too), seems to turn on whether Moral Nihilism is relevant. If it is relevant, Morality is in deep trouble. If not, then Morality, unlike Christendom, has little to fear from the onward march of Modernity.

Here is what I would have thought about this issue. If the Moral Nihilist, like Sinnott-Armstrong says, has pretty good arguments for thinking there really are no moral facts, arguments that, though not conclusive, should at least incline one towards agnosticism on the issue, then Moral Nihilism looks like a "relevant" possibility. If I can't respond to the Nihilist, who offers the kinds of considerations I accept against the existence of entities in other domains (for example, considerations like those the Atheist offers against the existence of "supernatural" entities and events like God and miracles), then I should seriously doubt, or at least reconsider, my moral convictions, whatever they happen to be. Since the Moral Nihilist starts from facts I would accept (people differ in their moral beliefs; cultures also differ widely; much of what people believe about right and wrong is due to culture, upbringing and social status; moral properties don't fit in well with our scientific view of the world; it's hard to see how moral facts could motivate; etc., etc.) and relies on forms of reasoning that I accept (inference to the best explanation, Occam's Razor, etc.), then I should see the Moral Nihilist as presenting me with good reasons to rethink whether there are moral facts. The Moral Nihilist strikes me as no different here from the Atheist, except perhaps the latter may have better arguments than the former (though, as noted, if Divine Command Theory is the only good theory of morality, it's obvious that they are in the same boat). So it seems to me that the "extreme" contrast class is the relevant one, at least insofar as the Moral Nihilist has the kind of well-motivated arguments that Sinnott-Armstrong says she does.

But this is not how Sinnott-Armstrong sees things, and this is where he offers a distinctive view about Moral Skepticism and about justified belief generally. Sinnott-Armstrong rejects the idea that certain alternative possibilities really are relevant or not. He's a skeptic about relevance. If there's no fact of the matter whether an alternative is really relevant, then there's no fact of the matter about whether a belief is justified without qualification, no fact of the matter whether any belief is really justified. At best beliefs are justified relative to contrast classes, and there is no fact of the matter what the right, correct, real, or relevant contrast class is. The Academic Moral Skeptic, who says that none of our moral beliefs are really justified because they are not justified out of the extreme class is mistaken, but so too is the non-Skeptic who says that plenty of our moral beliefs are really justified because they are justified out of the modest contrast class. Both are mistaken, for both presuppose that there is a fact of the matter about relevance. Sinnott-Armstrong's "Classy Pyrrhonism" is just the view that there is no fact of the matter about relevance. Hence there is no such thing as a belief's being justified without qualification. Beliefs are, at best, justified relative to contrast classes, and no particular contrast class is the "right" one. We can thus concede the force of the Nihilist's arguments while at the same time holding onto the epistemic "rationality" of our moral beliefs, but only the relative rationality of our beliefs, not the unqualified, "real" rationality of our moral beliefs.

Sinnott-Armstrong justifies his rejection of realism about relevance by running through cases where it seems really hard to say whether an alternative is relevant or not, and criticizing extant theories of relevance, theories from so-called "invariantists" and "contextualists." But I don't think hard cases and problematic theories should talk us out of the idea that some alternatives really are relevant and some really are not -- especially if giving up on "real" relevance means all epistemic justification is simply justification relative to a contrast class. Any belief at all would turn out justified to at least one contrast class (e.g., the contrast class including what is believed plus some obviously false alternative like a logical contradiction), while at the same time unjustified relative to another contrast class (e.g., the ones including radical skeptical hypotheses that cannot be ruled out in principle), with a whole host of contrast classes in between. And since any belief could be justified relative to at least one contrast class, any belief could be "insulated" from seemingly devastating objections by simply not including those alternative possibilities in a target contrast class. Just think if Christendom had thought of contrast classes. "Classy Pyrrhonism" just looks like permissive epistemological relativism to me.

Something has gone wrong. I agree with Sinnott-Armstrong that we don't yet have a fully adequate account of what makes an alternative possibility relevant. But I do think that if I have good evidence to believe an alternative possibility is really objectively likely (and not just a mere logical possibility), evidence consistent with other things I believe and consistent with standards of reasoning I employ elsewhere, then I cannot simply ignore it or dismiss it without being epistemically irrational. So if I have good evidence to think that Astrology may be false, or that Theism is false, or that Moral Realism is false, evidence consistent with other things I believe and consistent with standards of reasoning I employ elsewhere, then no matter how strongly I believe in Astrology, or the God of Theism, or that certain acts really are morally wrong, I cannot simply dismiss or ignore the Skeptic, the Atheist, or the Nihilist. The fact that my beliefs are relatively justified -- relative to a contrast class that doesn't include Skepticism about Astrology, Atheism or Nihilism -- is neither here nor there.

Sinnott-Armstrong's book confronts a profound issue in Western thinking: we tend to think of moral discourse realistically; we also tend to think of many of our moral beliefs as justified (indeed, some as highly justified); but we are also aware that moral facts don't easily fit in a "scientific" view of the world. We thus face a problem. One move is to give up a realist, "cognitive," construal of moral language, hence emotivism and its variants. Another is to face the Nihilist squarely and show why, in fact, there are moral facts in a "scientific" world. Sinnott-Armstrong tries a third view: justification doesn't depend upon being in a position to answer certain challenges, for justification is relative to contrast classes, and certain challenges don't show up in certain contrast classes. Instead of adopting moral relativism in the face of the Nihilist's arguments, as others have done, Sinnott-Armstrong embraces epistemological relativism about moral claims. As I've said, I don't think Sinnott-Armstrong's epistemic maneuver is the way to go. Indeed, isn't the denial of "real relevance" and "unqualified justification" simply the denial of a normative property that many people ordinarily assume is a real one?

There's a great deal more in Moral Skepticisms than I've talked about here. I've tried to focus on what struck me as the main line of argument, which struck me as very interesting, and I wish I had more time and space to talk about it even more. Overall the book was a delight to read. It's full of interesting arguments on all sorts of topics in moral metaphysics and moral epistemology. If you're interested in what I've called the main line of argument, or if you're simply interested in moral metaphysics and moral epistemology, it's truly a book worth reading. I highly recommend it to anyone curious about these topics.