Moral Value and Human Diversity

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Robert Audi, Moral Value and Human Diversity, Oxford University Press, 2007, 144pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195374117.

Reviewed by Diane Jeske, University of Iowa


Robert Audi's new book Moral Value and Human Diversity "describes the most influential kinds of ethical views and, without neglecting their differences, draws on what they have in common to formulate moral standards that can help with some of the major challenges now facing us -- individually and as societies" (viii). This project is important and undertaken all too rarely. Moral philosophers focus on attempting to defend their own views, usually via a critique of competing positions. While all philosophers understand the significance of this kind of intellectual endeavor, laypeople are likely to walk away from it with a sense of weariness: if the supposed 'experts' cannot reach agreement, they will conclude, we have even more reason for regarding moral questions as lacking objective answers. They will feel confirmed in the view that morality is just a matter of individual or societal preferences, standards, or mores, with no rational way of adjudicating competing positions. Audi does an admirable job of showing both laypeople and moral philosophers what the major moral theories have in common and why we are not driven to some form of moral relativism. He does this with the hope that we can actually make progress on some of the most pressing moral issues of our time.

In Chapter 1 Audi begins with a very brief presentation of four ethical theories: the virtue-based theory of Aristotle and the rule-based theories of Kant, Mill, and Ross. He then offers a view that, he claims, encapsulates the most important elements of all four of these views. Pluralist Universalism "would require optimizing happiness so far as possible without producing injustice or curtailing freedom (including one's own)" (17). The Aristotelian focus on character comes into play with Audi's claim that this Pluralist Universalist principle "is to be internalized -- roughly, automatically presupposed and normally also strongly motivating -- in a way that yields moral virtue" (17). Audi's own deontological leanings are apparent in his priority rule requiring that, in cases of conflict, justice and freedom take priority over happiness. He assumes that justice and freedom will not conflict because, he claims, justice requires as much freedom as possible "within the limits of peaceful coexistence" (17).

Once Audi has stated his priority rule, however, the accord between his four chosen ethical theories breaks down. No utilitarian would accept an obviously deontological priority rule, especially if justice is the element of Pluralist Universalism drawn from Kant. Perhaps a utilitarian could accept such a priority rule as a secondary rule of thumb, in the way that Mill understands the rules of justice in Chapter Five of Utilitarianism; after all, officials are not people whom we want to trust with decisions about when it is appropriate to violate 'rights.'

We might think, however, that, given Audi's aim of trying to show the four theories as having some common core, we can ignore questions about the status of this priority rule. My worry, though, is that doing so allows him to claim that there is "considerable agreement" among moral philosophers about what we ought to do (20). He claims that we all agree that one ought not kill, lie, or enslave, one ought to keep one's promises, help to relieve suffering, and develop one's capacities. He acknowledges that these are all prima facie obligations, and need to be balanced against one another in cases of conflict. For the utilitarian, however, the balancing will always proceed in a way that is distinct: all is to be subordinated to the promotion of happiness or welfare. This is why utilitarian moral theory seems to be at odds with Kantianism in the way that it approaches one currently very pressing issue: is torture ever morally permissible? These are the kinds of moral questions on which moral philosophers do not agree, and I am not sure that we do well to slide over our very different approaches to what is relevant in such cases.

My other worry about Audi's Pluralist Universalist Principle is that it invokes terms such as 'justice' and 'freedom' as though it is clear how to understand these terms. While Chapter 2 is devoted to an examination of value and the good life, there is no comparable chapter on the nature of justice or on the nature of freedom. He equates justice with "equal treatment of persons," but, again, that is a contested concept that needs analysis. Here we encounter an issue that faces any of us who want to try to write philosophy in a way that promotes Audi's goal of teaching "ethics widely and emphatically" (100): how do we balance philosophical rigor with accessibility to a wide audience? How do we convey the complexities of philosophical analysis without alienating our intended audience? I think that Audi has made a commendable start on such a project, and my points of criticism highlight more the difficulty of the task than any peculiar failings of the particular choices that Audi has made.

Audi rightly takes relativism as a topic that must be addressed in any book aimed at a general audience: all of us who teach ethics know that many of our students take some form of relativism as the clear and obvious truth about morality. Audi does a nice job of distinguishing circumstantial relativism -- the view that "what we ought to do depends on, and so varies with, and must be relativized to, the relevant circumstances" (25) -- from status relativism -- the view that "the justifiability … of moral principles is relative, for instance relative to custom, and that ethics therefore has no universally justifiable binding principles" (25). He also makes the important point that we do not need to accept status relativism in order to accept tolerance as an important value (26), although I wish that he had actually made the stronger point that whether status relativism can accommodate tolerance is an contingent matter that will vary from one set of circumstances to another. Later in the book he makes two other very important points regarding relativism: first, that pluralism about values is not a form of relativism (61), and, second, that the claim that the good life for an individual is relative to her preferences is not to embrace status relativism (80).

On p.3 of the book, Audi claims that there are two major challenges to theoretical ethics: (i) a practical challenge: "We need sound standards for personal, institutional, and international conduct," and (ii) a theoretical challenge: "naturalism seems to leave no place for value." The second challenge is addressed more briefly than the first, in Audi's discussion of relativism in Chapter 1, and in his discussion of the relationship between values and natural facts at the end of Chapter 2. This brief treatment of the issue of naturalism is quite appropriate in the context of a book aimed at a general audience: it is enough here to do as Audi does -- show why ethics and science are not in some sort of conflict and why we need not view value properties as mysterious. Chapters 3 and 4, then, focus on the first, practical challenge.

Audi identifies ten challenges for contemporary ethics on pp. 29-33, and then addresses these challenges more fully in Chapter 4. I do not have space to talk about all of these challenges, but think that several are worth some elaboration here. The first two challenges are what Audi calls the problems of religion-politics and of religious sensibilities. The first problem is about the appropriate boundaries between religion and government and the second is about when we, as individuals, ought to allow our religiously based commitments to motivate our conduct, particularly in the political realm. I thoroughly agree with Audi that these are serious challenges facing our diverse culture, but, just as with freedom and justice, I wish that some attention had been paid to the complexity involved in trying to determine what counts as a religion. For example, is Scientology a religion? How do I go about answering that question? Moral deliberation has to have analysis as a central component, otherwise familiar terms will get used in obfuscating ways. How to convey this to a lay audience is, as I have already said, the central challenge of anyone trying to make moral philosophy accessible to the general public.

I will mention only two other of the ten challenges identified by Audi: self-indulgence and the role model problem. Many people are narrowly focused on their own interests, and the history of humankind shows even the most casual of observers how dangerous this trait can be. But how do we get people to pick their heads up and see the world around them as presenting them with moral demands? Not, of course, by filling TV and magazines with designer-clad celebrities and 'bling'-laden sports stars. Neither do we do well by having leaders of corporations and banks engaged in unethical or overly risky behavior. We need to find ways to get our young people to think seriously about intrinsic value -- as Audi attempts to get his audience to do in Chapter 2 -- and to assess the media images they see in light of that deliberation. I cannot agree too strongly with Audi that "Both in educational institutions and in private life we must teach ethics widely and emphatically" (100). But, of course, here we find ourselves back at the religion-politics issue: how can we teach ethics in public schools when so many people view important ethical issues, such as homosexual relations and abortion, as having a religious foundation? This shows how well Audi has identified some of the major challenges we must face in the coming years.