Moral Virtue and Nature: A Defense of Ethical Naturalism

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Stephen R. Brown, Moral Virtue and Nature: A Defense of Ethical Naturalism, Continuum, 2008, 151pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826498717.

Reviewed by Emer O'Hagan, University of Saskatchewan


Virtue ethics such as Aristotle's are naturalistic in the sense that the values they uncover are the virtues supplied by nature itself; morality is understood to be built into our very biology by way of our telos, an end set by nature which sets the shape and point of moral life. Naturalism of this sort has the appeal of providing a ready connection between fact and value, the non-normative and the normative, giving it resources to address important meta-ethical problems. But the post-Aristotelian metaphysics of naturalism and teleology are not obviously compatible, and so it is also not obvious that a virtue ethic can be naturalistic as naturalism is understood today. Can a post-Darwinian view of science and the evolution of human beings accommodate virtue ethics, or is an ethics of character simply at odds with a view of persons as governed by biological forces aimed at genetic replication? This is the question Stephen R. Brown sets himself, arguing for a neo-Darwinian virtue ethic that "amounts to" a purely descriptive, evolutionary ethic, according to which individual humans can be morally evaluated in terms of how well they realize the human function or way of life, even while our "ultimate end" is genotypic continuation. Brown, building on the work of Philippa Foot and Rosalind Hursthouse, claims that virtue ethics has not been made sufficiently naturalistic and aims to make it so, while preserving our intuitions about which traits are virtues and what makes good persons good.

This is a worthwhile philosophical investigation but at times a frustrating read, as the motivation for the evolutionary ethic Brown advances is only made clear in the final pages of the book. Unfortunately Brown's argumentative strategy doesn't well serve the purpose of defending virtue ethics, although it may pique the interest of evolutionary ethicists who wonder whether virtue ethics is viable. It simply isn't clear, in the end, how the virtues can be understood as forms of human excellence grounded in the natural end of genotypic continuation, or how this ground shapes moral life in a way that the virtue ethicist can embrace. Still, Brown raises pressing problems both for virtue ethics and arguably for cognitivist naturalistic ethics, offers an interesting discussion of Aristotle's function argument and his view of justice as the cardinal virtue, and brings into view a conception of how we might make moral sense of human lives given what we know of the scientific facts.

In Chapter One, Brown defines ethical naturalism as a cognitivist position according to which ethical norms are grounded in natural facts. He suggests that cognitivism is required because it entails that there are ethical facts and that moral discourse is not systematically misleading (5), but given that naturalism happily co-exists with non-cognitivism, an argument for cognitivism is needed. More troubling yet is that in the final paragraph of the book Brown concludes that because the human end is reproductive success and this natural good is not obviously a moral good, it may be that morality's authority is illusory. He closes by gesturing at error theory, according to which moral discourse is systematically misleading and there are no moral facts. This leaves the reader in doubt about just what Brown takes himself to have shown in his defense of naturalized virtue ethics.

The naturalized virtue ethics advanced by Brown is a goods-based view according to which the goodness of the virtues derives from the goodness of our ultimate end. So virtues, while not theoretically fundamental, are ethically fundamental; they are the marks for which we look when evaluating individual human beings as good instances of the kind human being (14). Judgements of character are thus prior to judgements of right action. Nonetheless, the evaluation of actions need not make reference to the character of the actor. For example, if our end were eudaimonia, some acts could be evaluated with only reference to that (species specific) end. In a footnote, Brown notes a potential problem: by divorcing good acts from good character in this way it is possible to bypass the virtues altogether, and thereby undermine virtue theory. He suggests that the problem can be resolved by showing that the virtues are at least partially constitutive of our ends, but it is not clear that Brown ever shows this. Virtues are, on his view, proximate ends to our ultimate end of successful reproduction and so are practically necessary for the ultimate end, but not necessarily constitutive of it.

For Brown, the connection between virtue and biology lies in the fact that: "the logical structure of our ethical evaluations of human beings is identical to the logical structure of our non-ethical evaluations of non-human living organisms" (15). Beyond making a few claims about particular virtues, such as the claim that the natural end of a good mother is to raise good offspring (58), there is little discussion of just how the ultimate end, reproductive success, maps onto or informs any plausible virtue ethic. For example, why isn't the function of a good mother to raise many offspring? This lack of clarity leaves the reader at times uncertain of what is being claimed as the argument progresses.

Brown's defense of natural teleology in Chapter Two includes an interesting discussion of Aristotle's function argument. Brown argues that Aristotle merely assumes that a human has a function qua human being and goes on to plausibly suggest that we discard Aristotle's strategy of attempting to determine a thing's function by asking what it alone does better than any other thing, replacing it with a more contemporary way of determining function. Brown argues that biological accounts of function (a thing's function is what it was selected to do, or the goal-directed role it plays in a continuing system) fail to pick out a human function and so humans do not have a biological function in the technical sense of the term. Brown concludes that we should, following Terence Irwin, think of Aristotelian function as work: "the human ergon is what we do, our way of life, the characteristic processes and behaviors we exemplify and in which we engage" (38). The human ergon is characteristic human activity and the connection between function and virtue is made by preserving Aristotle's insight that a good instance of a kind is one that actualizes that kind's ergon well.

I had hoped that this chapter, entitled "Natural Teleology", would explain exactly how teleology is compatible with naturalism, and in such a way as to support an ethic focussed on excellences of character. Brown writes that nature is whatever the best science of the day tells us it is (2), and this, I would have thought, would support a biological view: from the standpoint of science, humans are designed to replicate their own DNA. But Brown considers and rejects this Darwinian version of the human function, noting that in order to explain normative notions like a good mother or good father, "we need a more robust theoretical structure than a facile 'Darwinism' that sees total genetic proliferation as the human function. But see Chapter 5 below." (35) In that fifth (and last) chapter, Brown argues that the natural teleonomic end of reproductive success is also our teleological end: "from a naturalistic perspective, reproductive success appears to be the only reasonable natural end. Thus as teleological ethical naturalists, it is our only choice" (120), which leaves one wondering why the Darwinian account of function didn't win the day 85 pages sooner. Brown holds that naturalized virtue ethics makes room for both intentional and non-intentional teleology, but his own commitment to teleology is somewhat puzzling. He concludes that it ought at least to be taken seriously as an explanatory strategy and that it could be supported by a transcendental argument or a "useful fiction" (45). At the end of the chapter on natural teleology it wasn't clear to me what distinguished teleological from non-teleological views of nature, and Brown's claim that some philosophers believe neo-Darwinian theory shows that there is teleology in nature while others do not, did not help to clarify.

In Chapter Three, "Good Human Beings", Brown asks what makes human beings morally good human beings? Crucial in Brown's analysis is the claim that "We evaluate ourselves and one another along the same lines as we do specimens of any species of living thing" (54). The evaluative strategy is: find the species' function, establish a norm and then apply the norm to individual members of the species. The logical structure of evaluation is framed by reference to the way of life of a species by which individual members are seen to be good or defective qua thing of their kind; ethical evaluations have this teleological framework. Here Brown adopts four human ends, advanced by Rosalind Hursthouse: the ends of individual survival, the continuation of the species, a thing's characteristic freedom from pain and characteristic means of enjoyment, and its good functioning in a social group (53).[1] A particular character trait can be known to be a virtue if it enables a person to realize one or more of these four ends. Brown's theoretical support for adopting these characteristic ends is not supplied (he indicates that critical discussion of these issues will occur in Chapter Five, where he claims that the ends must be justified by an ultimate end) and those who do not find it intuitive that the continuation of the species is one such end are left wondering whether non-breeders (gay and straight) will be counted defective on Brown's version of naturalized virtue ethics.

The is/ought gap looms large for ethical naturalism and in Chapter Four, Brown discusses five standard forms of the problem with a view to showing that the is/ought gap is not insurmountable. The chapter would be stronger if the objections targeted the view Brown ultimately advances. For example, the discussion of the version of the problem concerned with the motivational difference between values and facts (values are motivational, facts are not) is addressed by simply granting that all moral imperatives are, in a special sense, hypothetical imperatives but adding that they are in a sense unconditional: "Since everyone desires happiness, the moral norms turn out to be hypothetical in form. However, the norms are not hypothetical in Kant's sense, because it is not up to you to want happiness or not. By nature we all want happiness." (98) We want to avoid the misery of getting caught telling lies and so the imperative 'avoid misery by not telling lies' constrains us. When, in the final chapter, we discover that the real end of our nature is successful reproduction and that this end serves as the foundation for all other ends, we are likely to want the motivational problem to be put, paraphrasing Korsgaard, in a slightly different way: "how could the fact of my design as a replicator for DNA give me a moral reason to do anything?"[2]

So why does Brown suppose a naturalistic virtue ethic is fated to become an evolutionary ethic? Apparently the need for a unified teleological theory makes it so. In the fifth and final chapter, Brown asks how the four ends he adopted from Hursthouse in Chapter Three can be plausibly claimed to be human ends. With a manifold of ends the theory will be either vacuous (our ends are whatever we seek) or far too open-ended, Brown claims, so without a unifying final end we will be unable to justify these ends (unlike Hursthouse, he does not believe that educated observation or ethology will inform us of our ends). Once we see that several of the ends on Hursthouse's list are proximate ends serving the end of the continuation of the species, or more precisely, the continuation of a genotype or evolved trait, we have the needed unification: "Neo-Darwinism can explain, in principle, why the other supposed ends are our ends: they are our proximate ends because their presence served the ultimate end" (117). But even if this were true, more is required to show that our ends are justified than that they serve, or are causally related to, a final end.

To give him his due, Brown goes on to pose and respond to the hard question: If our natural end isn't good, why suppose that its supporting ends are good? According to Brown, the goodness resides in its being ours, as our end makes us what we are and do and, as a result, is good. He writes:

1. Reproductive success is our natural (ultimate) end. [neo-Darwinism]

2. Our end is rightly called good. [Aristotle]

3. Therefore, reproductive success is good. (121)

Unfortunately, Brown's commitment to his own argument is not entirely clear. He goes on to remark, truthfully enough, that a naturalist need not be a neo-Darwinian and might even reject naturalized virtue ethics. He adds that one might reasonably reject neo-Darwinism as having a place in ethics and reject his claim that a theoretically unifying human end is needed. He writes that intentional creatures like us are likely to find a view like Hursthouse's very sensible, adding that there may even be some truth to it. He concludes:

In seeking a natural ground for our moral judgements of others, we have ended with something else than we might have wished for: something natural, but not clearly good, except that it is our natural end. It might be the case that, for morality to do its job, so to speak, it must be held to be objectively grounded -- even if it is not. A transcendent sort of grounding might seem to provide a deeper grounding than one immanent in transitory and contingent human nature. But this is all the naturalist has. (122)

This is a somewhat strange note on which to end the book. Many virtue ethicists will reasonably enough balk at the claim that the real human end is what geneticists tell us it is, and will wonder how the human ergon or way of life is to be reconciled with this scientific view of the human end. Still, in Moral Virtue and Nature, Brown tackles an interesting and important issue and his book is likely to stoke interest in the question of whether, and to what extent, a neo-Darwinian view of human nature can be made compatible with a teleological virtue ethic.

[1] Rosalind Hursthouse, On Virtue Ethics (Oxford University Press, 1999), p. 202.

[2] See Christine Korsgaard's discussion of the normative question as it applies to evolutionary ethics in her The Sources of Normativity (Cambridge University Press, 1996), p. 15.