Moral Writings and The Right and the Good

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Prichard, H.A., Moral Writings, edited by Jim MacAdam, Oxford University Press, 2002, 272pp, $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199250197.

Ross, W.D., The Right and the Good, edited by Philip Stratton-Lake, Oxford University Press, 2002, 220pp, $18.95(pbk), ISBN 0199252653.

Reviewed by Mark Timmons, University of Memphis


The philosophical story of H. A. Prichard (1871-1947) and W. D. Ross (1877-1971) is the story of intuitionism’s progress from the rather bare bones statement of this metaethical position that we find in Prichard to the fairly well fleshed out version that we find in Ross. Prichard and Ross were members of the same circle of Oxford intuitionists (led by Prichard) that included H. W. B. Joseph, E. F. Carritt, and John Laird, a circle that perhaps represents the glory days of British intuitionism. Prichard published remarkably little: only two lectures and two papers in moral philosophy, the most famous being his widely anthologized paper, ’Does Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?’, published in 1912. However Prichard is reported to have written much that he never published--writings that were nevertheless circulated among his colleagues over whom he apparently had substantial philosophical influence. In his short preface to The Right and the Good, for instance, Ross claims that his ’main obligation’ is to Prichard who, he says, wrote ’exhaustive comments and criticisms’ on the book in manuscript form. Intuitionism’s progress was interrupted in the mid-1930s with the publication of A. J. Ayer’s Language, Truth, and Logic in which Ayer, in opposition to intuitionism, defended a version of emotivism, signaling noncognitivism’s initial volley that was followed by wide-spread rejection of intuitionism. (However, intuitionism continued to find some able supporters such as A. C. Ewing in the 1940s.) But at the start of the twenty-first century we now see a revival of intuitionism in the work of Robert Audi,1 Russ Shafer-Landau,2 and in a new collection of essays, Ethical Intuitionism: Re-evaluations (Oxford, 2002), edited by Philip Stratton-Lake. So the story of intuitionism’s progress continues and this is what makes these new editions of Prichard’s moral writings and Ross’s book particularly welcome.

A collection of Prichard’s writings in moral philosophy was edited by Ross and published posthumously in 1949 under the title Moral Obligation, and in 1968 a new edition of these writings, Moral Obligation and Duty and Interest, with a preface by J. O. Urmson, was published--the extended title referring to the addition of Prichard’s previously unpublished 1928 inaugural lecture as White’s Professor of Philosophy. As part of their recent ’British Moral Philosophers’ series, Oxford University Press has published an expanded version of the 1968 collection, now entitled, Moral Writings, edited by Jim MacAdam, that includes four never before published essays plus two letters, one of them from Cook Wilson to Prichard in 1904 and the other from Prichard to Ross in 1932. The new essays include ’Kant’s Fundamental Principles of the Metaphysics of Morals’, six (edited) chapters of a never completed book, which MacAdam has entitled ’Manuscript on Morals’, and two short essays, ’What is the Basis of Moral Obligation?’ and ’A Conflict of Duties’. In addition, this volume includes the editors’ introductions from the two earlier editions, a new introduction by MacAdam, a complete list of Prichard’s published work, the editor’s notes on the ’new’ writings, and a bibliography divided into reviews of Prichard’s books, obituaries, and secondary literature.

Also in the same series from Oxford is a new edition of Ross’s 1930 The Right and the Good with an excellent introductory overview of Ross’s views by editor Philip Stratton-Lake and a bibliography divided into works by Ross, works about Ross, and works on ethical intuitionism. Stratton-Lake has also added a set of editor’s notes to the text, many of them usefully referring to changes in Ross’s view that were reflected in his 1939 The Foundations of Ethics.

I will make a few remarks about the new Prichard material and then proceed to consider, in order, key metaethical views of Prichard and Ross in order to mark what I see as progress.

In ’What is the Basis of Obligation’ (undated), Prichard’s main aim is to defend the claim that the question mentioned in the title ’admits of no general answer’, a view he never gave up and a constant theme in many of his other moral writings. The 1928 essay, ’A Conflict of Duties’ is interesting because in it Prichard modifies his former view about conflicts of duty (about which I will say more below). The most significant addition is ’Manuscript on Morals’ which, although including discussions that overlap with some of Prichard’s other moral writings, contains discussions of Sidgwick’s views and an illuminating account of how intuitionism can plausibly incorporate the idea that the consequences of actions are morally relevant. Cook Wilson’s 1904 letter is included because in it he briefly explains his ’instinctive aversion to the very expression ’theory of knowledge’ (284), which, as MacAdam notes, was influential in Prichard’s case against moral theory. Prichard, in his 1932 letter to Ross, asks Ross to forgive him for ’taking a sort of pot shot at something in your book’ (286). But the pot shot turns out to be a significant worry about the inclusion of beneficence as a basic prima facie duty, which Prichard thinks also applies to Ross’s notion of a duty sans phrase. The undated essay on Kant’s moral philosophy reads rather like a set of lecture notes and serves to make clear how much progress in our understanding of Kant’s views has been made in the past thirty or so years by sympathetic interpreters. Let me now turn to metaethical issues.

I’ve been using, and will continue to use, ’intuitionism’ in a common but deliberately loose sense to cover three metaethical views characteristic of these philosophers: (1) non-naturalist moral realism, (2) a foundationalist moral epistemology featuring the notion of self-evidence (’intuitionism’ in a narrow sense), and (3) robust ethical pluralism—the view that there is an irreducible plurality of fundamental duties, goods, and virtues. (Moore’s version is not robust in this way.)

We find in Prichard very little elaboration of these doctrines. He never doubts that terms like ’right’ (by which he meant ’being under an obligation’ or ’having a duty’) name some property or attribute and, like Moore, he claims that the property of rightness is ’the kind of attribute [that] is sui generis, i.e., unique, and therefore incapable of having its nature expressed in terms of the nature of anything else’ (169). Prichard, unlike Moore, does not employ the distinction between natural properties and nonnatural properties (a distinction with which Moore struggled). Nor does he use the open-question argument in defending this view (as did Ross), though he employs what we might call the ’argument from mistaken identity’, a close cousin of the open-question argument. Prichard claims that the question ’What is moral obligation?’ (understood as asking about the metaphysical nature of obligatoriness) is ’not a real question’ (115) because, he claims, we can readily see upon inspection of various attempted definitions of the term ’ought’ that (1) in asking such a question, we must have an understanding of the term and thus in some sense already know what it is to be morally bound, and that (2) any proposed analysis or definition of the term is easily seen to ’covertly resolve moral obligation into something else which is not moral obligation’ (116). Apparently, this was lost on many moral philosophers including Spencer, Hutcheson, Kant, Hobbes, Paley, and Joseph who, as Prichard reads them, attempted the impossible and thereby had a confused understanding of the nature of morality. According to Prichard, we can use clear thinking to recognize the fundamental differences between such simple properties as rightness and goodness on the one hand, and the distinct properties that philosophers have mistakenly identified them with on the other. Furthermore, we can recognize important differences in attributions of fundamentally distinct moral properties such as rightness and goodness. Such a regimen will apparently help us focus on the true sui generis nature of the moral properties in question. Although Prichard remarks that such properties are necessarily related to certain other non-moral properties—something has the property of rightness or of goodness ’because’ it possesses other nonmoral properties—he does not discuss the nature of this necessary relation.

Prichard defended a kind of particularist moral foundationalism, according to which our knowledge of obligation and of value is grounded in our (non-inferentially) apprehending particular cases in which these properties are present. These particular apprehensions are the basis on which we come to grasp the self-evidence of general moral rules. So, in grasping the fact that some particular action is right, writes Prichard,

[W]e appreciate the obligation immediately or directly, the appreciation being an activity of moral thinking. We recognize, for instance, that this performance of a service to X, who has done a service to the would-be agent, ought to be done by us. This apprehension is immediate, in precisely the sense in which a mathematical apprehension is immediate, e.g., the apprehension that this three-sided figure, in virtue of its being, must have three angles. Both apprehensions are immediate in the sense that in both insight into the nature of the subject directly leads us to recognize its possession of the predicate; and it is only stating this fact from the other side to say that in both cases the fact apprehended is self-evident. (13)

This passage may make it seem as if you either see it (the obligation) or you don’t, a common complaint about epistemological intuitionism. But as Prichard makes clear, being in a position to grasp the self-evidence of an obligation may require appreciating certain facts about one’s circumstances that are ’preliminaries’ in the process of thinking about ethical issues. Prichard mentions two such preliminaries: getting clear about the consequences of a proposed course of action (in order to be clear about the full nature of the action) and getting clear about the nonmoral facts of one’s situation. Both bits of preliminary thinking are part of a process that Prichard calls ’general’ in contrast to moral thinking. Prichard says very little about the notion of self-evidence or about moral apprehension or about how we may legitimately work from apprehensions of particular self-evident truths in ethics to more general moral rules. Ross has more to say.

Prichard’s rejection of moral theory (by which he meant monistic attempts to specify some one underlying feature that ’renders’ or makes an action right) is the big mistake featured in his famous 1912 paper. Apparently he embraced pluralism about the right and the good, but we don’t find any attempt on his part to list fundamental moral obligations, moral virtues, or other intrinsic goods. We do find an interesting development in Prichard’s view about the problem of conflicts of duties, a problem that any pluralist has to face. In the undated ’What is the Basis of Moral Obligation?’, which MacAdam places first among the essays that are otherwise ordered chronologically, Prichard claims that (1) obligations admit of degree, (2) in cases of conflicting obligations, the proper question to ask is ’which obligation is greater?’ (3) but there is no general method for resolving such conflicts, and so (4) when they occur we must take all the circumstances bearing on the decision into account in trying to determine which obligation is the greater. This same view is mentioned in a footnote in his 1912 paper, but in ’A Conflict of Duties’ Prichard denies that there can be degrees of obligation (duties) that apply to some particular case, because for an action to be an obligation it must be true that all other actions one might perform are wrong and hence not (at all) obligatory. Instead, Prichard claims that ordinary talk about a conflict of duties is really about something else.

If we ask ourselves what this something else is, we seem driven to say that … what is called a conflict of duties is really a conflict of claims on us to act in different ways, arising out of various circumstances of the whole situation in which we are placed. Further, we find no difficulty whatever in allowing that what we call claims on us may differ in degree, or that where there are two claims on us so differing, the act which there is greatest claim on us to do is duty. (79)

This solution differs importantly from Ross’s doctrine of prima facie duties that has been extremely influential in moral theorizing since the 1930s.3

Whereas much of Prichard’s writing in ethics is polemical and his favored version of intuitionism tends to be in the background of his writings, in Ross we find a clear statement, elaboration, and defense of intuitionism. In brief, the advance in the intuitionist position that we find in Ross compared to Prichard involves the following ideas. First, regarding ethical pluralism, Ross’s view makes two advances over Prichard’s. Ross rejects Prichard’s proposal to understand conflicts of duties in terms of conflicting claims. The notion of a claim, says Ross, expresses part of the idea of an interpersonal duty from the point of view of the person to whom one has a duty but not from the agent’s own point of view (something we want to capture), and furthermore talk of claims in cases of duties to oneself is ’artificial’ (20). Instead, Ross introduces the notion of a prima facie duty which he sometimes explains in terms of subjunctive conditionals (19) and sometimes in terms of tendencies (28). Both ways of understanding this notion are problematic, as a number of philosophers have argued. Indeed, the notion of prima facie duty might seem like a setback for intuitionism. But I follow Stratton-Lake in thinking that the idea here can be understood in terms of reasons. To talk about a prima facie duty is to talk about the fact that an action, in virtue of having certain properties, gives one a reason (not necessarily sufficient) to perform or refrain from performing the act (depending on the feature in question).

Another advance, I think, is Ross’s attempt to partially systematize ethics by initially setting forth a list of seven basic prima facie duties (fidelity, reparation, gratitude, non-maleficence, justice, beneficence, and self-improvement) and a list of four basic intrinsic goods (virtue, pleasure, the apportionment of pleasure to virtue and pain to vice or, more simply, justice, and knowledge). Given his pluralist theory of intrinsic good, Ross is able to subsume the prima facie duties of justice, beneficence, and self-improvement under a prima facie duty to promote the good (24-7), thus reducing the number of basic prima facie duties to five.

Earlier I mentioned that Prichard was apparently an ethical pluralist, and my qualified claim was meant to indicate that given his adamant anti-theory stance, it is not so clear to me that Prichard is committed to pluralism or is best interpreted as a kind of particularist (the kind that denies that ethics can even be partially systematized) about the nature of rightness and goodness. In the preface to The Right and the Good, Ross claims that Prichard agrees with his treatment of rightness, which is some evidence of commitment to pluralism. But if Prichard is best read as a particularist, then whether one thinks of Ross’s systematic pluralism as genuine progress will depend on one’s views about plausibility of pluralism compared to particularism.

The second area of progress concerns intuitionist foundationalism about moral knowledge. Here again, I think the advance is in the greater amount of detail we find in Ross compared to Prichard. Ross thought that, in the order of discovery, we come to recognize certain prima facie duties in a particular case (e.g., one sees that in the case at hand it would be prima facie wrong to break a promise) and then by a process of ’intuitive induction’ one comes, upon sufficient reflection, to grasp the relevant self-evident truth (e.g., the general truth that we have a prima facie obligation of fidelity). Ross also makes clear that although the relative stringency of conflicting prima facie duties is not self-evident in a particular case (and thus Ross denied the likelihood of having moral knowledge about particular cases of duty, given typical moral complexity), he nevertheless held that the prima facie duties of fidelity, reparation, and nonmaleficence are ’weightier’ than the prima facie duty of beneficence, even though in certain cases considerations of beneficence might outweigh any (or a combination) of the others. Finally, Ross also made some advance in thinking about moral metaphysics. He is clear, unlike Prichard, about basic moral properties being nonnatural (though this was famously advanced earlier by Moore), but more importantly he addresses the kind of ’because’ relation linking moral properties to nonmoral properties in terms of the relation of ’resultance, which Jonathan Dancy has argued differs importantly from the relation of supervenience’.4

The progress from Prichard to Ross, then, involves some doctrinal changes but perhaps more significantly it involves providing intuitionism with a certain amount of substance that is lacking in Prichard.

The elements of Ross’s intuitionism—his realist-nonnaturalist moral metaphysics, his pluralism about the right and the good, his moral epistemology, and the main arguments Ross used to defend these views—are explained and commented upon in Stratton-Lake’s excellent 40 page introduction to Ross’s text. Stratton-Lake’s essay is especially valuable because, as a sympathetic interpreter of Ross, he explains why certain standard objections often used to dismiss this or that aspect of intuitionism (e.g., its metaphysical commitments are ’otherworldly’, its epistemology requires believing in some mysterious sixth sense, and so on) are simply misguided because they represent a mere caricature of intuitionism generally and Ross’s view in particular. In addition to setting the record straight on such matters, Stratton-Lake also takes the liberty of disagreeing with certain details of Ross’s position. Most notably, perhaps, is his view that although Ross was correct in thinking that basic moral properties such as rightness and goodness are nonnatural, Ross was mistaken in thinking that such properties are simple. According to Stratton-Lake, the moral property of rightness (oughtness), for instance, involves the idea of certain features of an action giving us reason to perform the action (xxii). Since the concept of a reason is a nonnatural concept, and irreducibly so, rightness, on Stratton-Lake’s view, is a complex nonnatural property. (Scanlon5 seems committed to this kind of view.) Furthermore, understanding prima facie rightness (obligation) in terms of reasons allows the intuitionist to make sense of conflicts of duties in a way that avoid Prichard’s misleading talk of ’claims’ and Ross’s own puzzling talk of prima facie duties.

I think intuitionism has its share of philosophical problems but as mentioned earlier it has made a comeback, and the new editions of Prichard’s moral writings and of Ross’s 1930 book should help the cause.6


1. See R. Audi, ’Intuitionism, Pluralism, and the Foundations of Ethics’, in W. Sinnott-Armstrong & M. Timmons (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996; and his forthcoming book, The Good in the Right, Princeton: Princeton University Press.

2. See R. Shafer-Landau, Moral Realism: A Defense, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.

3. Philip Stratton-Lake pointed out to me that in all likelihood Ross had the notion of a prima facie duty as early as 1927 (see Ross’s ’The Basis of Objective Judgments in Ethics’, International Journal of Ethics 37, 1927, pp. 113-27), thus perhaps preceding and even inspiring Prichard’s notion of a claim.

4. See J. Dancy, Moral Reasons, Oxford: Blackwell, 1993, ch. 5, and his forthcoming book, Ethics Without Principles, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

5. See T. M. Scanlon, What We Owe to Each Other, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, pp. 1-13.

6. For helpful discussions about Prichard and Ross, I wish to thank my colleagues, Tim Roche and John Tienson. I also wish to thank Philip Stratton-Lake for his comments on the penultimate draft of this review.