Moralism: A Study of a Vice

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Craig Taylor, Moralism: A Study of a Vice, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2012, 187pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773540101.

Reviewed by Cheshire Calhoun, Arizona State University


Craig Taylor's thoughtful and keenly observant reflection on moralism in everyday life and ethical theory isn't what I expected from the title, although it's a very good philosophical read and deserves to be on the bookshelf of those who are interested in critiques of impartialist ethical theories. Taylor describes the book as part applied ethics and part metaethics, although it is his metaethical view about the status of moral judgments that dominates the book.

The metaethical views are developed in chapters four, five, and six. Those chapters advance the following claims: (1) morality should not be regarded as adjudicating the permissibility of acting on all other values, such as aesthetic values and the value of humor, friendships, and personal projects; rather, morality is one among many value domains each of which have independent authority; (2) morality requires of us not just the making of moral judgments, but also a developed moral sensibility, emotional capacities of response, and the know-how to respond effectively; moral judgment divorced from emotional responsiveness and knowing how to respond risks being shallow; (3) in cases where reason underdetermines moral action, first-person judgments about what morality requires are determined by our particular moral identities and character; there is thus a notion of what is morally required that is independent of universalizability (129).

What, one may wonder, do these kinds of claims have to do with moralism? Taylor proposes that moralism is "a vice that involves failure to recognize what moral thought or reflection requires (and does not require) of us in the broad sense" (153). Insofar as ethical theories mistakenly (in Taylor's view) subject the pursuit of all non-moral values to a test of moral permissibility, they fail to recognize what moral thought does not require of us, viz., that all nonmoral value domains be subordinate to moral values. Insofar as moral thinkers proceed as though the application of concepts and principles in action-guiding moral judgments is all that is required for moral thought, they fail to recognize what moral thought, understood broadly to include our immediate emotional and practical responses, does require of us. And insofar as impartialist moral theories assume that all moral requirements are universalizable, they fail to recognize the importance of first-personal judgments about what one could or could not do that are grounded in the particularities of an individual's moral identity and character.

Because Taylor's definition of "moralism" is so broad as to capture impartialist ethical theories in its net, I'm dubious that this book is about moralism as we ordinarily understand it in everyday life. But this doesn't much matter since the defects that Taylor wants to get at are interesting whatever we wish to call them.

Taylor follows Bernard Williams's objection (in "Persons, Character, and Morality") that impartialist theories make unreasonable demands on agents by failing to acknowledge the independent authority of persons' projects and commitments. Taylor generalizes this claim, arguing that there are a plurality of value domains -- the value of friendship, projects, humor, art -- that have independent authority. Thus, even if impartialist theories can provide us with, for example, a justification of the moral permissibility of devoting time and resources to friendships and projects under conditions of dire global need -- as Garrett Cullity does -- the thought that friendships and projects must be morally justified in the first place is itself objectionable. As Taylor says, "What we need to reject here is the presumption implicit in impartial morality that our personal relationships and projects stand in need of justification" (68). Taylor does not wish to deny that there are some circumstances in which doubts about the moral permissibility of one's friendship and project-related activities could be raised. But in most cases, "spending time with a friend is not a matter of conscience at all," and to think that it is is to have "one thought too many."

I found it a bit difficult to pinpoint exactly why the universal applicability of the question "but is it morally permissible?" is objectionable. Since Taylor grants that impartialists could justify devoting time and resources to friends and projects even under conditions of global poverty, the objection cannot be that impartialist theories are necessarily over-demanding. He also grants that the universal applicability of the permissibility question does not mean that, in normal cases, we need to entertain thoughts about moral permissibility, nor need the thought "it is morally permissible" operate as a motive for action.

So what is the objection? Taylor's view as I understand it (and I'm not sure I do) is something like this: We have a conception of a good or complete human life. Central to leading a good human life is being properly responsive to a plurality of values. Among those responses are immediate, unthinking feelings of pity, mercy, and sympathy through which we recognize the humanity of others. These immediate emotional responses are constitutive of our conception of what it is to be and to suffer as a human being (33) and of others' capacity to make demands on us (78). These are the responses that are centrally connected to morality. But there are other immediate responses that are central to the good human life, e.g., the responsiveness characteristic of friendships and the responses constitutive of a sense of humor. Given that the full range of immediate emotional responses is necessary for appreciating the plurality of values and leading a good human life, anything that tends to undermine our responsiveness in a particular domain also diminishes our capacity to lead a humanly good life. Taylor claims that to ask 'Is friendship permissible in this world?' is "to undermine that pattern of responsiveness between friends that is internal to recognizing the values that friendship involves and the place that such values occupy in a complete human life" (71; see also 83). Similarly, giving morality an adjudicating role when moral values come into conflict with aesthetic values or with humor undermines our responsiveness to these values.

But it's hard to see why impartialism has this consequence or why Taylor's alternative of a plurality of competing value domains avoids the charge. It can't be the case that being properly responsive to value domain X means allowing those values to trump in all cases. Taylor himself allows that there are cases where responsiveness to friends or to the funny should be trumped by our sympathetic responses to others. And if that's the case, it isn't clear why either being open to the possibility that some friendly activity or forms of humor are morally impermissible (as on the impartialist view), or the possibility that sympathetic responses should take priority over friendship- or humor-related responses (as on Taylor's view), undermines our responsiveness to friends or humor. Such undermining would occur only if much of our friendly activity and forms of humor are in fact morally impermissible.

Despite these worries about Taylor's critique of impartialist moral theories, there is still an important challenge here that is similar to the challenge Susan Wolf raises in "Moral Saints": in all those cases where, say, humor appears to come into conflict with morality -- as much humor does -- we need some account of why, in many cases, we should "bracket" our moral responses and just enjoy the joke. Taylor offers us just such an account. And in doing so, he explains why we might feel that those who seem incapable of enjoying a good joke because all they can focus on are its moral demerits are guilty of the vice of moralism.

Chapters two and five develop the second sort of complaint about moralism that I mentioned at the outset. Moralism can take the form of thinking that all that moral thought and reflection require of us are the making of moral judgments -- that is, applying moral concepts and principles to persons, actions, and situations. The Bostonian Puritans in A Scarlet Letter morally judge Hester Prynne but they seem devoid of the capacity to see Hester Prynne as anything more than a token of the type "adulteress." In particular they lack the "primitive" or "immediate" emotional response of pity through which they might have recognized Hester's humanity, that is, her capacity to suffer guilt and remorse as a morally accountable being. One important form that moralism takes is the making -- and pronouncing -- of moral judgments while simultaneously failing to recognize the humanity of those about whom we make those judgments. We do not think 'What is it, or will it, or could it be like for them as morally accountable beings to have done such a thing?'

The vice of moralism here is a kind of moral shallowness that is compatible with one's judgments being correct: "what is demanded of us is not merely the capacity to make moral judgments but also certain capacities of response: the capacity to respond to people and events in ways that show our understanding of others and of the situation we find ourselves in" (87). That understanding comes, in part, through feelings of pity, mercy, and sympathy. In part, it comes through what Murdoch describes as a "careful and just attention" (87) to ourselves and others -- a just attention whose primary aim may not be to make moral judgments. Among the things to which we ought to "justly attend" are our own emotional responses and lack of responses.

In his subtle discussion in chapter three ("Trusting Oneself") of the case that motivated the writing of the book -- the furor surrounding Australian photographer Bill Henson's inclusion of a photograph of a naked twelve-year-old girl in an exhibition -- Taylor argues that "it is characteristic of a kind of moralizer that he does not trust his own responses; he does not, even if he is consciously aware of it, trust himself" (19). He fears that "with only his own responses to go by he may not know what to think when he feels that he should know" (50). So, when confronted with disturbingly ambiguous art works, the moralist simply condemns rather than doing the difficult work of reflecting on his own emotional responses and what they might mean to the question of whether this photograph was obscene or exploitive. In doing so, the moralist fails to treat morality as something that is difficult (40).

The importance and difficulty of serious moral reflection on ourselves and the kind of character we have becomes thematic in chapter five, "Moral Judgment and Moral Reflection." The center of this chapter is a subtle and insightful discussion of Lord Jim. Jim, when presented with the opportunity to help save pilgrims aboard his sinking ship, rescues himself instead. Jim is able to make the moral judgment that he failed miserably in his moral duty. But what remains unclear throughout the book is whether Jim has come to grips with either the internal source of that failure or with his real motives for judging himself harshly. The novel, in leaving unresolved the reader's doubts about what Jim's underlying character really is, also invites the reader to reflect on the difficulty of knowing one's own character and being confident that, when the moral challenge presents itself, one will not, like Jim, fail to respond. The lesson Taylor takes from this is that serious moral thought must include not only self-scrutiny but also awareness of the ways that such self-scrutiny may be distorted by our weaknesses, evasions, and frailties (100). Given the difficulty of determining true character, to be intolerant of ambiguity and over-ready to make moral judgments about others' and our own character is to be guilty of moralism.

Chapter six, "Moral Difference," takes up the topic of moral incapacities, and with it the third complaint that I mentioned at the beginning. The moral difference referred to in the chapter title is the difference of moral identity from one individual to the next and the difference in what we find ourselves morally required to do (or not to do) given our particular moral identity. Although derived largely from Peter Winch's discussion of first-personal judgments about moral requirements that are not universalizable, Taylor's argument also echoes Harry Frankfurt's discussion of volitional necessities. Once again, Taylor focuses his discussion around literary examples, one of which is from Billy Budd (there is also an exceptionally nuanced and sensitive discussion of an example from Coetzee's Disgrace).

Following Winch, Taylor accepts that impartial reasons may point toward conflicting moral judgments. Individual moral character may nevertheless render the agent morally incapable of taking one of the options. Winch himself says that he could not condemn Billy Budd, a man innocent before God. On Taylor's own view, not only may moral values come into conflict in a way that cannot be resolved by appeal to impartial reasons, but moral values may come into conflict with other values, for example, the value of friendships or projects. We should not regard the judgments that individuals make about what they are required -- whether morally required or required out of friendship -- to do in these conflict situations as universalizable. Although Taylor does not say this, I assume that he would regard it as moralistic to insist that if agents are morally required to do anything at all, then all agents must be required to do exactly the same thing.

In the concluding chapter, Taylor explores journalistic moralism and political protestors' moralism. Here again, Taylor appeals to the idea that there are different domains of value, one of those domains being that of political values. What Taylor finds objectionable in journalists' moral criticisms of political decisions is the way that those criticisms are presented independently of attention to what it is realistically possible for political actors to do and to the political values at stake, such as securing national interests. Instead, both journalists and protestors may insist that "only the perfectly just outcome is acceptable" (150). The unfortunate result of thinking in moral terms that are not sensitive to political realities and values is, Taylor argues, the undermining of our participation in politics, because we end up not addressing the political questions that most need to be addressed, such as 'What are the proper limits of the state's power in pursuing its strategic or vital interests?' This will involve balancing the competing values of the state's interest and global justice.

Taylor's book is rich with interesting insights and extraordinarily subtle handling of literary and real world cases. One comes away with a broader understanding of the myriad ways that moralism may infect personal and public life. There is also an attractive and deep vision of dimensions of the moral life that do not typically make their appearance in moral theories. If there is any one thing that is unsatisfying about the book, it is that it is unclear how we are to decide when moral considerations are and are not to take priority. In a footnote, for example, Taylor asserts that responsiveness to friendships should give way to sympathetic responses if we are partying with our friend while our neighbor's house is burning (ch. 4, n. 11), but he rejects the idea that friendships should give way to the desperate plight of the global poor. He also says that moral considerations always have some force where political values are at stake (145-146), but are generally inappropriate where aesthetic values and the value of humor are at stake. This reader wondered on what basis these judgments were being made.