According to moral error theory, moral judgments attempt to describe a reality that doesn't exist. Unsettling though error theory is, some philosophers find the arguments for it compelling. Christopher Cowie's book contributes to the growing literature on moral error theory by offering a sustained defense of it from a prominent objection.
The objection, which Cowie calls the argument from analogy with epistemic judgment (henceforth, the "analogy argument"), runs roughly as follows. Given the parallels between the moral and epistemic domains, if there were sound arguments for moral error theory, then there would also be sound arguments for epistemic error theory. But epistemic error theory implies radical skepticism: there is no epistemic reason to accept anything, including moral error theory itself. Given that there's sufficient evidence to reject such skepticism, there's sufficient evidence to reject any argument for a theory that implies it. Since there's sufficient evidence to reject such arguments, there's sufficient evidence to reject any argument for moral error theory, too.
Replies to arguments of this type tend to fall into one of two camps. Some, such as Streumer, accept the analogy, embracing the radically skeptical conclusion that there's no epistemic reason to believe anything, but deny that this provides sufficient grounds for thinking that error theory is false. Others, such as Olson, also accept the analogy but distance themselves from the argument's radically skeptical conclusions, contending that there are suitable surrogates for epistemic facts. Cowie plumps for a third option: error theorists should reject the analogy between the moral and epistemic domains. Given the important differences between these domains, error theorists should deny the existence of moral facts, but affirm the existence of epistemic ones.
At the outset, Cowie states that his book has two aims. The first, fairly modest aim is to systematize the literature regarding the argument from analogy while it's still possible to do so. The second, more ambitious aim, is to contend that the argument fails. In our estimation, the book largely succeeds in achieving its first aim, but we doubt that it accomplishes its second aim.
Before we provide reasons for this assessment, let's consider the book's main lines of argument. Chapters 1 and 2 distinguish between two different kinds of arguments for moral error theory. "Internalism-based" arguments maintain that ordinary moral judgments concern "genuinely normative" moral reasons. These are considerations that favor, are weighty, and are categorical (or external) insofar as they apply to agents regardless of their contingent commitments. Since there are no such reasons, the argument concludes that moral judgments are systematically mistaken. "Irreducibility-based" arguments hold "that moral judgments are concerned with a kind of peculiar property or relation -- irreducibly normative properties or relations" (17). Since there are no such properties, the argument concludes that moral judgments are systematically untrue.
Corresponding to these two kinds of arguments for moral error theory are two versions of the argument from analogy. The first appeals to
Internalism-parity: If an internalism-based argument for the moral error theory is sound, then an analogous argument for the epistemic error theory is also sound (53).
The second endorses
Irreducibility-parity: If an irreducibility-based argument for the moral error theory is sound, then an analogous argument for the epistemic error theory is also sound (ibid.).
Chapters 3 and 4 argue that internalism-parity arguments from analogy fail. The primary contention is that epistemic reasons, properly understood, aren't genuinely normative (as moral reasons must be). Rather, epistemic reasons are merely "institutional," akin to those associated with fashion, law, the rules of games, and etiquette. Since they are, internalism-based arguments against moral reasons simply don't apply to epistemic ones. This is the primary disanalogy between the moral and epistemic domains that the book endeavors to establish.
Chapter 5 presents two arguments against irreducibility-parity arguments. The first is that epistemic reasons are reducible to descriptive facts. While Cowie doesn't offer a positive proposal for what such a reduction would look like, he contends that if epistemic reasons were institutional, then it's easier to see how they would be reducible to descriptive facts. The contention that epistemic reasons are merely institutional, then, does double duty: it's supposed to block both internalism-based and irreducibility-based arguments from analogy. The second argument in Chapter 5, in effect a rear-guard action, states that error theorists may plausibly reject the existence of epistemic facts. According to Cowie, this wouldn't be nearly as catastrophic as it seems since its "worst effects are offset by surrogates for epistemic judgments, which are modeled on normative judgments in sports and games, etiquette and law" (116).
In subsequent chapters, Cowie elaborates on the claims and commitments made in these arguments. Chapter 6 considers in greater detail whether reasons for belief could be conventional, or whether belief has some constitutive aim or standard that could serve to put another wedge between reasons for belief and reasons for action. Chapter 7 offers a defense of "veritism," the idea that truth and avoidance of falsity are the only epistemic aims. The truth of veritism would help Cowie's case, since it would simplify any attempt to reduce epistemic reasons to mere descriptive facts. Chapter 8 considers and rejects the claim that evidence itself is a normative notion, while Chapter 9 addresses the concern that epistemic error theory is self-defeating. Chapter 10 considers a further rearguard action, arguing that, contrary to the analogy argument, the existence of normative epistemic reasons fits well enough with moral error theory.
Our summary of the book prescinds from many of its details, and so doesn't do justice to the book's scope and intricacy. The book covers a lot of ground in an economical, lucid, and lively manner. In our view, then, it largely succeeds in collating and making accessible views and arguments that have their homes in different corners of philosophy. Moreover, the book helpfully brings to the foreground an issue that anyone sympathetic with the argument from analogy must address more satisfactorily, namely, what grounds epistemic normativity. These virtues notwithstanding, we have significant reservations about the book's primary maneuvers.
The book's stated dialectical aim is to establish that the argument from analogy fails. It's not easy, however, to discern what Cowie means by this. In some places, the book seems to take a hard line: the analogy argument fails because it's unsound, as the parity premise, which states that moral and epistemic judgments are relevantly analogous, is false. In other places, it seems to push a very soft line: the argument fails because "it is not obviously sound . . . because the parity premise is not obviously true" (216). Along the way, many other things are said about crucial claims supporting the analogy argument, including that they are rejectable, that they fail to persuade, and that we're fully entitled to reject them. While we don't see a way to reconcile these claims, we suspect that Cowie's project is best understood as providing undermining defeaters for some of the claims composing the analogy argument.
We doubt that the book is successful on this score. Consider the first objection that Cowie raises concerning the internalism-parity premise. The objection asks us to consider how we'd respond to a philosophy student who asks what reason he has to conform to epistemic norms. Cowie thinks that the natural response is to cite the prudential advantages of following epistemic norms; citing such advantages "seems an overwhelmingly obvious thing to do. It would be really strange not to do so" (63). Compare this to how we'd respond to a student who asks why he should bother conforming to moral norms. The only plausible response, according to Cowie, appeals to the non-instrumental authority of moral reasons. Hence, we should conclude that, while reasons to conform to moral norms would be non-instrumental, reasons to conform epistemic ones are merely instrumental.
We see things differently. If someone asked us why he shouldn't violate moral norms, we might ask him to consider the prudential disadvantages of immorality. But we wouldn't stop there. We'd also appeal to thought experiments, like Plato's ring of Gyges story which illustrates how the norms of morality and prudence can diverge. It seems to us that, even when wearing the ring, agents would have excellent reason to abide by moral norms against rape and murder. After all, these actions harm people whose well-being matters no less than that of the ring-bearer. In the epistemic case, we'd likewise begin by appealing to prudential considerations, but again we wouldn't stop there. We'd also try to get the student to consider the value of states such as understanding, knowledge, and wisdom, and the badness of states such as ignorance, superstition, and self-deception. In order to press our case, we'd want to identify a thought experiment parallel to the ring of Gyges story, which would isolate the epistemic value of these states from the prudential value of having them.
That's tricky, but not impossible. We can imagine people who are so coddled by technology that they no longer need to be epistemically rational in order to satisfy their desires. (Think of the obese, pleasantly distracted people on the spaceship in the Pixar movie Wall-E). We're inclined to think that such people would have genuinely normative epistemic reasons to do such things as govern their beliefs responsibly and avoid ignorance and superstition, just as we have genuinely normative moral reasons not to behave wickedly when we can get away with it. Cowie might not share this intuition, but he doesn't provide any reason to doubt our verdict here. Certainly, there's nothing obvious about the answer he wants us to give. So appeals to what it would seem "natural" to say to a philosophy student don't take us very far here.
Cowie's second objection to the internalism-parity premise appeals to the phenomenon of trivial truths. We understand the argument to hinge on this conditional claim:
If there is strong evidence to believe trivial truths, then there are thereby genuinely normative epistemic reasons to believe them.
The argument then asserts that, since there aren't such reasons to believe these truths, there is not strong evidence to believe such truths. That, however, can't be correct, as there is strong evidence to believe these truths. So the conditional claim stated just above is false. Given that advocates of the analogy argument are committed to its truth, they are thereby committed to a falsehood.
Although there are several ways to respond to this argument, we believe the conditional stated above is false: a genuinely normative epistemic reason to believe a proposition p is not determined simply by the strength of the evidence for p. Rather, it's determined by whether believing p would contribute to an agent's achieving epistemically valuable states such as understanding and wisdom, and whether failing to believe p would contribute to her being in epistemically bad states such as being ignorant or bull-headed. Since believing trivial truths typically doesn't contribute to being in states of either sort, then there's typically no genuinely normative epistemic reason (in the sense specified above) to believe them. We take this view about epistemic reasons to be wholly compatible with the argument from analogy. If so, then advocates of the analogy argument are not committed to the truth of the conditional displayed above, contrary to what the trivial truth argument states.
Having voiced our reservations about the objections Cowie raises against the internalism-parity thesis, we return to (what we call) the disanalogy strategy. This strategy, recall, maintains that while there are no moral reasons, there are epistemic reasons, which are institutional. Cowie's version of this strategy appeals to:
(A) If there are reasons to conform to epistemic norms, that is only because they bear some appropriate relation to prudential norms (62-3, 68, 75).
Prudential norms, in turn, are both non-institutional and "stand alone." If they provide reasons, that isn't because they bear some appropriate relation to some other type of non-institutional norm, such as moral ones.
Prudential norms play a significant role in Cowie's version of the disanalogy strategy; according to (A), they are what would explain why there's reason to conform to epistemic norms. While Cowie says little about the character of prudential norms, it makes sense to ask whether or not they supply reasons. In raising this question, we take for granted the following truism: reasons just are considerations that favor or justify. Nothing could be a reason and fail to (defeasibly) favor or justify. This implies that institutional norms themselves don't supply reasons. Institutional norms, after all, enjoin agents to do everything from the inane to the horrific. But agents don't have reason to do what is inane or horrific simply because there happens to be an institutional norm that enjoins them to do so.
We can now canvass the two primary options available to proponents of (A). The first supposes that, while prudential norms are directives for acting, they don't supply reasons. This option is problematic. Given the truism above and (A), it implies that there's no reason to conform to epistemic norms and, so, the disanalogy strategy fails. It also implies that Cowie's version of the disanalogy strategy doesn't represent a distinctive reply to the analogy argument. It's just a version of the surrogate strategy defended by Olson.
The second option supposes that prudential norms supply reasons. This approach could be run in two ways. One way is to maintain that prudential reasons are genuinely normative (in the sense specified above). This route also faces serious concerns. Here's one: there's no deep disanalogy between moral reasons and reasons to conform to epistemic norms; they're each genuinely normative. Here's another: the arguments moral error theorists offer for ruling out genuinely normative moral reasons also threaten to rule out genuinely normative prudential reasons and, so, reasons to conform to epistemic norms. If, however, these arguments rule out reasons to conform to epistemic norms, then there would be neither moral reasons nor reasons to conform to epistemic norms. Ironically, tying reasons to conform to epistemic norms so closely to prudential reasons appears to render moral error theory increasingly vulnerable to the very objection to which the disanalogy strategy is supposed to reply.
Run in the other way, this approach holds that prudential norms supply reasons, but these reasons aren't genuinely normative, since they're merely hypothetical. As it happens, Cowie finds this view unpalatable, explicitly rejecting it. More importantly, the view gives rise to yet another challenge to moral error theory. In principle, moral error theorists could maintain that while epistemic reasons appear categorical, they're really just hypothetical. However, if this strategy is apt for the epistemic realm, it looks equally apt for the moral realm. If it is, then there's no interesting disanalogy between moral and epistemic reasons; they're each hypothetical. It also follows that our moral judgments would accurately represent moral reasons, albeit of the hypothetical variety. That, however, is incompatible with moral error theory.
Our thanks to Chris Cowie for his comments on a draft of this review.
 We've each developed different versions of the argument; see Spencer Case, "From Epistemic to Moral Realism," Journal of Moral Philosophy, 16 (2018): 541-562 and Terence Cuneo, The Normative Web (Oxford University Press, 2007). Cp. Nathan Nobis, Truth in Ethics and Epistemology: A Defense of Normative Realism (dissertation, University of Rochester 2005), and Richard Rowland, "Moral Error Theory and the Argument from Epistemic Reasons," Journal of Ethics and Social Philosophy, 7 (2012): 1-24.
 Bart Streumer, Unbelievable Errors (Oxford University Press, 2017): 129-154.
 Jonas Olson, Moral Error Theory: History, Critique, Defense (Oxford University Press, 2014).
 We say it "largely" succeeds because we think Cowie's decision not to discuss so-called entanglement arguments represents a serious lacuna in the discussion, rendering the discussion in chapter 10 incomplete at best. See Case (2018) and Cuneo (2007), chapter 8.