Morality and Metaphysics

Morality And Metaphysics 1

Charles Larmore, Morality and Metaphysics, Cambridge University Press, 2021, 238pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108472340.

Reviewed by Karl Schafer, University of Texas at Austin


Charles Larmore’s book weaves together several essays to develop an account of the foundations of morality and normativity. Along the way, it includes insightful discussions of the relationship between morality and interpretation, how this gives rise to a distinctive “ethics of reading”, the nature of duties to the self, and the limits of self-knowledge. But I think it is fair to say that the focus of the book is Larmore’s distinctive and important views about the proper approach to foundational questions about normativity, which he takes to be importantly different from those inspired by Hume (on the one hand) and Kant (on the other).

Like many philosophers in recent years, Larmore approaches such broadly metaethical questions from a perspective that is distinguished by two basic commitments. First, he is a committed realist about normative facts. And second, he is inclined to characterize the normative domain in terms of the central role that reasons (or the reason-relation) play within it. In combining some form of normative realism with a broadly “reasons first” approach to normativity, Larmore’s approach to foundational normative questions shares much in common with the recent work of philosophers like Derek Parfit or Tim Scanlon. But unlike those philosophers, Larmore has little patience for the quietist dream that we might be able to defend normative realism on the metaphysical cheap. Rather, he takes realism about normative reasons to be committed to a non-trivial (and in some ways deeply anti-naturalistic) metaphysics. In this sense, Larmore often goes further than these authors, or even “more robust” realists like David Enoch or Russ Shafer-Landau, in defending a metaphysically unapologetic form of normative realism.

In this way, as he says, Larmore remains in important respects “an old-style rationalist”—that is, a philosopher who is “immune to the allures of both Hume and Kant” and so is willing to defend a form of “Platonism about reasons” according to which reasons constitute “a third dimension of reality, neither physical nor psychological” (Larmore 2021, 7–8). As such, there was much in Larmore’s discussion of these issues that I found congenial, even when I did not completely agree with it. Indeed, the perspective that Larmore articulates in these essays is close to one I once defended, and still see as powerful and important. So, Larmore’s defense of this position was very welcome and often compelling to me. But while Larmore’s positive claims often struck me as attractive and deep, his discussion of opposing views was sometimes less satisfying. To some degree, this is due to his relative neglect of the contemporary literature on these issues, with the exception of a few “big names” like those mentioned above. But such concerns also extend to Larmore’s treatment of historical figures like Hume or Kant, where Larmore sometimes seemed to me to leave the reader with a somewhat distorted picture of the location of his views within the historical philosophical landscape.

This phenomenon was particularly striking, to me at least, in Larmore’s treatment of his relationship to Kant—in particular, his critique of Kant’s conception of the “autonomy of reason”, which plays a central role in the book. Following a broadly “constructivist” interpretation, Larmore casts Kant (and his followers) as endorsing a fundamentally anti-realist conception of the nature of normativity:

Kantians may differ from Humeans in their eagerness to deduce necessary constraints governing the sorts of rules we can in this way coherently make our own . . . [but] they agree that reasons cannot form part of reality itself. . . . Both . . . are consequently at one in holding that reasons are something we introduce into the world from without, coloring the neutral face of nature with normative distinctions of our own devising (Larmore 2021, 33).

Thus, on Larmore’s reading, both Kantians and Humeans treat “normative distinctions” as coming “into existence by our doing, as though we were their authors”—as opposed to recognizing that they “come into existence simply in virtue of the fact that we exist” (Larmore 2021, 179).

As such passages should indicate, Larmore reads Kant as a sort of anti-realist about the ultimate “sources of normativity”—one who takes rational agents like you and me to be (in some sense) the “authors” of the normative principles, laws, and reasons to which we are subject. But is that really the correct reading of Kant on these issues?[1] Already, from these brief passages, I think we should have our doubts. For surely Kant did not mean to deny that normative principles or reasons “form part of reality”? Indeed, it is hard to think of anything in Kant’s philosophy that is “more real” than the moral law as the fundamental principle of practical reason. And isn’t one of the most distinctive features of Kant’s moral philosophy the idea that rational beings are deserving of respect “simply in virtue of the fact that they exist” and not, say, because of anything anyone has done over and above such existence? If Larmore takes Kant to be opposed to such claims, something fundamental has gone awry in his interpretation of him.[2]

In such moments, it is hard not to feel somewhat disoriented by Larmore’s critique of Kant—almost as if one has passed over into an alternative reality in which Kant’s philosophy developed in a different, and more anti-realist, manner than it did. After all, while Kant is not a thorough-going Platonist about reasons or normativity in Larmore’s sense of these terms, he is no normative anti-realist either. Rather, the great challenge in interpreting Kant, here and elsewhere, is to understand his attempts to chart a third way between these two options—one that is neither robustly Platonist nor anti-realist. Whether or not this is possible is, of course, an open question.

But we will not make much headway in this project if we insist that Platonism or anti-realism are the only options here from the start. This, to my mind, is the fundamental problem with Larmore’s discussion of Kant, and arguably his approach to these questions more generally. For Larmore, philosophy ultimately does force us to make a basic choice between a quite robust sort of normative Platonism and one form or another of normative anti-realism—a choice that leaves little room for views like Kant’s (or many others).

Nowhere is this clearer, again, than in Larmore’s discussion of Kant’s commitment to the “autonomy of reason”, which Larmore takes to be the view the “source of the validity” of all such principles is the self-legislation of reason, which “institutes or lays down the principles by which it operates” (Larmore 2021, 124). Crucially, Larmore opposes this conception of reason as autonomous. His preferred conception is one on which reason’s principles have “an antecedent validity that our reason does not establish, but instead must acknowledge” (Larmore 2021, 120). Here we can see Larmore’s basic opposition between a Platonist view of reason on which reason must “simply acknowledge” independently given principles by being “receptive” to them and a broadly anti-realist view on which reason “institutes” or “imposes” principles (more or less as it pleases) on an otherwise normatively inert reality.

Against this background, Larmore attempts to argue that Kant’s conception of reason as autonomous rests on a fundamental mistake about the nature of reason itself:

Reason cannot be a law unto itself. It guides our conduct only through being responsive to reasons that exist independently of our attitudes of approval, independently of our endorsement of rules, and independently of our ideas of the reasons we have, ideas that may be true or false. (Larmore 2021, 6)

In this way, Larmore argues that (what he takes to be) the Kantian doctrine of the autonomy of reason is hopeless. Indeed, according to Larmore, it is hopeless for at least two reasons. First, it simply mischaracterizes the phenomena it aims to explain. After all, most of the principles that are fundamental for our conduct are not principles we impose upon ourselves, but “principles whose antecedent validity we must simply acknowledge”. And even “when we [do] impose principles of thought and action on ourselves, there must seem to us to be reasons for imposing them” if that imposition is to be rational. Thus, even in those cases in which it applies, the (allegedly) Kantian account of the nature of our reasons must rest on a more fundamental reasons that cannot be explained in the same fashion. For these reasons, Larmore concludes that, “Autonomy makes no sense as a global account of the nature of reasons” (Larmore 2021, 34).

This is an important argument, but is Larmore’s presentation of the Kantian view fair either to Kant or to contemporary Kantians? Or does it rest on what they (at least) should regard as a false dichotomy between two models of reason—(i) reason as “merely receptive” to independently existing reasons and (ii) reason as creating reasons and “imposing” them on the world—neither of which a Kantian should accept? Indeed, isn’t the whole point of Kant’s conception of reason that reason can be autonomous only insofar as it acknowledges certain fundamental normative principles that are in no sense “up to us” to accept or reject as we please?

Interestingly, these are points that Larmore himself makes in some form. After all, as Larmore notes, when Kant describes reason as autonomous, his main point is to stress that reason functions properly only insofar as it is governed by principles or laws that are internal to it and the rational order. In this sense, reason should never be governed by mere “alien influences” that are foreign to it. But, as Larmore notes, “reasons are hardly foreign bodies with respect to reason”. Rather, “They are precisely that to which we must respond if we are to be able to exercise our reason at all” (Larmore 2021, 129). So, there need not be any conflict between the idea of reason as autonomous and the idea of reason as responsive to reasons, provided both notions are understood in the proper fashion.

But if this is right, then there is not even a prima facie conflict between the idea of reason as autonomous and the idea of reason as responsive to reasons. Rather, reason’s autonomy consists in precisely this responsiveness to reasons. What is odd about Larmore’s treatment of these points is not that he makes them—and, I should add, makes them well – but that he takes them to be objections to Kant, as opposed to seeing them as central aspects of Kant’s views. Indeed, we might go further here and say that Kant’s challenge to robust normative Platonists like Larmore is to explain how it is possible for reasons to have the status they must have in order to be reasons at all—the status, that is, of not being mere “foreign bodies with respect to reason”.[3] There are many things for a Platonist like Larmore to say in response to this, of course. But his way of setting up the debate seemed to me to exclude genuinely Kantian responses to this question from consideration from the start.

This, in turn, was connected to another puzzling aspect of Larmore’s treatment of Kant that I want to note here. Larmore reads Kant as rejecting the idea of reason as “at one and the same time cognitive and motivating” during the critical period (Larmore 2021, 128–29). But the whole point of Kant’s conception of practical reason (and his associated conception of practical cognition) is that practical reason is both cognitive and practical to its core.[4] Indeed, it seemed to me that it was Larmore, and not Kant, whose worldview left no real room for a genuine form of practical reason as a capacity that is both cognitive and practical, at least in Kant’s sense of these terms. After all, for Larmore, reason as the capacity to respond to reasons “must be understood as . . . essentially receptive, not self-legislating” (Larmore 2021, 127–28). Thus, for Larmore, reason can be seen as responsive to objective reasons only if it is receptive in something like the manner in which the senses are receptive to external objects. Once again this is a common Platonic thought. But it would mean that reason must always have, in Kantian terms, a fundamentally theoretical relationship to its object. And so, like Hume’s very different conception of reason, it would effectively rule out the existence of a genuine form of practical reason in the Kantian sense from the start.

Once again, I take Kant to be interested in showing us that there is another option here—one on which reason is both autonomous or self-governing and responsive to objective reasons. Larmore correctly focuses our attention on this issue, and much of what he says about it seems to me very insightful. But nonetheless his approach also seemed to me suffer from a typical “Platonic blind spot” in this regard—a refusal, that is, to acknowledge the existence of practical forms of knowledge or cognition of the sort that is central to both the Aristotelian and the Kantian traditions. Of course, there are many philosophical questions we might raise about such notions. But we will have little hope of doing justice to Kant’s conception of reason and its autonomy if we exclude it from serious consideration from the start, as Larmore often seemed to do.[5] Nonetheless, I want to reiterate that this is an extremely rich and insightful work of philosophy. Indeed, it is the mark of excellent philosophy like this that even its (alleged) blind spots are illuminating in this way. So, I urge everyone to read it for themselves.


Engstrom, Stephen. 2009. The Form of Practical Knowledge: A Study of the Categorical Imperative. Harvard University Press.

Korsgaard, Christine. 1996. The Sources of Normativity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Larmore, Charles. 2021. Morality and Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press.

Merritt, Melissa. 2018. Kant on Reflection and Virtue. Cambridge University Press.

Schafer, Karl. 2015. “Realism and Constructivism in Kantian Metaethics 1: Realism and Constructivism in a Kantian Context.” Philosophy Compass 10 (10): 690–701.

———. 2016. “Evolutionary Debunking Arguments, Explanatory Structure, and the Motivations for Moral Anti-Realism.” In Taking Sentimentalism Seriously, edited by Remy Debes and Karsten Stueber. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

———. 2019. “Rationality as the Capacity for Understanding.” Noûs 53 (3): 639–63.

Setiya, Kieran. 2012. Knowing Right From Wrong. Oxford University Press.


[1] In making these points, Larmore seems to be influenced by the “constructivism” of Korsgaard (1996). But (as Larmore himself notes) the degree of anti-realism he attributes to Kant goes well beyond what Korsgaard would attribute to him. See Schafer (2015) for more discussion.

[2] To be fair, as Larmore notes, it is certainly not difficult to find passages in which Kantians, and indeed Kant himself, speak in a manner that would encourage a reading like Larmore’s. But such passages need to be read carefully in the context of Kant’s other commitments to avoid creating a picture of Kant as more of a normative anti-realist than he is.

[3] For an insightful discussion of this issue, see Setiya (2012), and see Schafer (2016) for some discussion of its relevance to both broadly Humean and Kantian views.

[4] See the discussions in Engstrom (2009) and Merritt (2018) here. For some of my views on this issue, see Schafer (2019).

[5] Compare his discussion of Anscombe’s conception of practical knowledge, where he writes that “Only a magical kind of knowledge could bring its object into being by the very act of knowing it, could be ‘the cause of what it understands’. Knowledge involves getting it right. The idea of rightness disappears if the object of knowledge is supposedly produced by the knowledge itself, as opposed to being what it is independently of our knowing it” (Larmore 2021, 231)