Morality and Our Complicated Form of Life: Feminist Wittgensteinian Metaethics

Placeholder book cover

Peg O'Connor, Morality and Our Complicated Form of Life: Feminist Wittgensteinian Metaethics, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2008, 178pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271033792.

Reviewed by Susan Hekman, University of Texas at Arlington


Peg O'Connor's goal in this book is an ambitious one: changing the dominant metaphor in metaethics. Rejecting both the realist and anti-realist approaches to metaethics, O'Connor argues that we need a radically new starting point in our discussions of morality. To that end she employs two arresting metaphors: a villa in Bordeaux that has no foundation but derives its stability from balanced relationships among a host of factors, and felting, a process by which elements are fused together into an indistinguishable whole. The new basis for metaethics that O'Connor proposes is what she calls "felted contextualism," an approach rooted in Wittgenstein's philosophy. The impetus for the Wittgensteinian approach to metaethics that O'Connor develops is a problem arising from feminist inquiry. To be philosophically and politically compelling, feminists, she asserts, must have a well-developed metaethics with a stable grounding for their arguments about oppression. Articulating this stable grounding is the task that O'Connor sets for herself.

At the center of O'Connor's Wittgensteinian approach is her interpretation of his concept of grammar. For Wittgenstein, she asserts, grammar is not absolutist or relativist, but stablist. This statement reveals O'Connor's overall approach to Wittgenstein' philosophy: the rejection of dichotomies. Her thesis is that Wittgenstein's philosophy provides a way of overcoming the dichotomies that structure contemporary metaethics and have created its current impasse. Wittgenstein's philosophy, in contrast, shows the way out of these dichotomies by providing a heterogeneous rather than homogeneous perspective. She builds on Wittgenstein's emphasis on the complexities of discourse to argue for a metaethics that starts with the assumption that moral normativity, like other forms of discourse, is rooted in this complexity.

O'Connor begins with a discussion of feminist ethics and moral theory that orients her subsequent analysis. Although she praises the "short but illustrious history" of feminist ethics, she asserts that more needs to be done. Specifically, feminists must be able to provide a stable grounding for their claims without falling prey to the dichotomies that have plagued discussions of metaethics. This is where Wittgenstein's concept of grammar comes in. The stability feminists seek, she asserts, can be found in Wittgenstein's understanding of grammar as non-dichotomous. Grammar provides the basis for our practices within language, but it is not an absolutist basis. Likewise, Wittgenstein's philosophy urges us to see ethics as in language, not as a transcendent realm. Moral life, like all aspects of life, is inherently social, public, material and practical (p.10).

In Chapter 2 O'Connor carefully distinguishes her position from that of the rival approaches of realism and antirealism. Arguing that both sides in this debate lead to untenable positions, she lays the groundwork for her own strategy. In Chapter 3, "Neither a Realist Nor an Antirealist Be," she claims that the basic problem of both approaches is that they rely on the dichotomy between world and language. Wittgenstein, by avoiding this dichotomy, provides an alternative starting point for metaethics. The key to Wittgenstein's position is his emphasis on practice. Starting from practice in ethics leads us to the conclusion that nothing is inherently normative, but, rather, that something has normative authority and binding force only in use (p.59).

O'Connor develops this perspective in more detail in the next chapter, "Felted Contextualism: Heterogeneous Stability." Her question is how we can describe a world whose elements are imbricated and mutually constitutive. Her answer is the image of the felted sweated. Felting is a process that transforms wool fibers like yarn into a dense tangled mat in which the individual fibers cannot be distinguished; felting, in other words, is irreversible (p.61). Transferring this metaphor to human life, she asserts that our world is one in which human agency, facts of nature, and social practices are felted together, producing a weave that cannot be untangled. This felted world is the only context in which there are norms and normative authority. The stability arising from O'Connor's felted contextualism provides a different kind of stability than that of other metaethical approaches. Once more she turns to Wittgenstein to establish her argument. Wittgenstein's concept of language games is the basis for the stability she outlines. Language games are always enmeshed and entwined. Certainty, furthermore, is produced in the practice of language games. Rejecting Avrum Stroll's interpretation of Wittgenstein as a foundationalist, O'Connor asserts that a better reading of his philosophy is that our language use shapes the world and the world shapes our language -- we can transcend neither (p.85). And, she asserts, the moral language game is no exception.

In Chapter 5 O'Connor takes on the main task of her book: explaining how the felted stable world of practices and language games form the basis for morality. Her thesis is that normative status is not something inherent or essential, but conferred through our way of living. Her Wittgensteinian understanding of grammar comes into play here. Grammar, she asserts, is both arbitrary and non-arbitrary. Grammar is a part of our felted world; it is what stands fast for us. The practices of the felted world do not presume a world/language divide, but, rather, reveal that the natural and the social are intermingled. Normative authority, she concludes, can be explained in terms of grammar and necessity -- "lived mustness" -- that is neither objectivist nor subjectivist (p.104). What Quine calls the "pull toward objectivity" is rooted in the training and education through which normative authority gets a grip on us.

O'Connor began her study by claiming that felted contextualism requires a shift in our understanding of moral epistemology. Explicating this understanding is the subject of the rest of her book. Her first move is to replace "moral epistemology" with "moral understanding." Morality, she asserts, is created and maintained through humans' practices with each other made possible by language. Justifications always occur within a language game or a set of practices. This perspective allows O'Connor to return to her fundamental problem: how to avoid relativism in feminist inquiry without retreating to a form of absolutism. In the final chapter she asserts that felted contextualism offers diversity and pluralism without relativism. There is both a deep contingency and stability within all aspects of our world. She asserts in conclusion, however, that felted contextualism does not preclude objectivity. Objectivity in a felted world will have a dynamic, relational character connected to responsibility. It is an on-going achievement, not a state of affairs.

Taking on the dominant assumptions of contemporary metaethics is no mean feat, but O'Connor manages to do so with impressive force in this book. She outlines nothing less than a radically new basis for metaethics and moral epistemology that challenges received opinion in the field. Her use of Wittgenstein's philosophy in the realm of metaethics is innovative and arresting. The fact that Wittgenstein had little to say about ethics makes her accomplishment that much more noteworthy. As her survey of rival conceptions reveals, her position does not so much refute other approaches as shift the ground on which arguments in metaethics rest. She will, I'm sure, not convince all of her rivals that their approaches are in error. But they would do well to grapple with the issues that she is raising.

The greatest virtue of O'Connor's approach is her rejection of the dichotomies that have structured so much contemporary thought. She joins a chorus of thinkers today who have identified the dichotomies of modernism as self-defeating. Dichotomies such as world/language, natural/social, objective/subjective force us into a philosophical dead-end. Both sides of the dichotomies are untenable and lead to positions that are, ultimately, indefensible. O'Connor uses Wittgenstein's philosophy to avoid this dead-end. Her emphasis on practice and what she calls felted contextualism provide an alternative that is more philosophically productive than the rival conceptions.

O'Connor briefly mentions the similarity between her position on practice and the intermingling of heterogeneous elements and that of Joseph Rouse. This similarity is significant but it is important to note that there are many more philosophers writing today that share the perspective that O'Connor articulates. Rouse's concept of intra-action is echoed in the work of Bruno Latour and Andrew Pickering, among others. Pickering's metaphor of the mangle, in particular, is strikingly similar to O'Connor's felting. Even more significantly, there are a growing number of feminists who are applying this perspective to feminist issues (see Alaimo and Hekman, Material Feminisms). The work of Karen Barad and Donna Haraway in science studies, Elizabeth Grosz in studies of the body, and that of many others illustrates how an intra-active approach can enrich feminist accounts. Reference to this literature would have strengthened O'Connor's account of metaethics by connecting it to a vibrant new literature.

As is often the case when a philosopher stakes out a radically new position, there are loose ends that remain. More detail on what a felted contextualism looks like would have made O'Connor's position stronger. At the end of the book the reader is still a bit confused about how the felted moral world is structured. Another issue that needs attention is how to reconcile the shared character of language games with the marginality of feminism. Typically feminists are arguing against shared assumptions in order to articulate their positions. In the context of an analysis of Frederick Douglass's speech "What to the Slave is the Fourth of July?" O'Connor tries to deal with this problem by arguing that we should ask ourselves how we can expand the conditions for moral understanding. Given the centrality of this issue for feminism she needs to devote more attention to this question.

A final problem is the concept of objectivity that O'Connor introduces at the end of her book. Objectivity, she claims, is not static; it is dynamic and relational. It entails widening the context of inquiry by including marginalized perspectives. This is all well and good, but it departs so far from the accepted definition of objectivity that one wonders why O'Connor uses the concept at all. Given her critique of dichotomies it would seem to make more sense to reject this concept which is one side of a very prevalent dichotomy. The same criticism could be made of her briefly stated claim that our obligations of justice can be universally binding (p.167). In the context of her argument it is hard to imagine how the universalizing of moral judgments could be made compatible with felted contextualism.

But these are relatively minor quibbles. O'Connor's book is important and thought-provoking. I'm sure it will be widely read and appreciated not only by metaethicists and feminists, but by all who are interested in contemporary moral questions.