Morality and Political Violence

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C. A. J. Coady, Morality and Political Violence, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 317pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521705486.

Reviewed by Christine Chwaszcza, European University Institute, San Domenico di Fiesole, Florence


Morality and Political Violence argues for the metaethical claim that the tradition of Just War Theory (JWT) provides a fruitful systematic framework for the ethical analysis of contemporary war and, more broadly, violent conflict. Coady defends JWT as an analytic framework that is conceptually adequate for addressing the relevant problems and is general in the sense of not being confined to theorists who subscribe to a Catholic tradition in ethics (p. 10ff.).

By focusing on violent conflict, Coady goes beyond the traditional considerations of JWT that concern interstate war (i.e., the traditional "war among princes") and reflects on such issues as revolution, terrorism, and humanitarian intervention. In addition, Coady's discussion of warfare addresses not only traditional concerns, such as the status of noncombatants and requirements of proportionality, but also issues that are specific to twentieth-century warfare, such as the use of weapons of mass destruction, mass bombardment, and the use of air forces, as well as mercenarianism, which is an old topic of new relevance that has been hardly explored. Morality and Political Violence is a copious collection of ethical puzzles and conflicts that are united by the appeal to JWT as a framework for analysis. The reader will find allusions to the history of ethics, but most of the time Coady develops his arguments systematically via an analysis of the concepts of violence, peace, and aggression (esp. chaps. 1, 2, 13) and by discussing particular conflicts (esp. chaps. 6-12) and their treatment by other theorists, most prominently militarists, pacifists, and Michael Walzer, whom Coady considers a social contract theorist (p. 17).

The success of a metaethical claim such as Coady's seems best assessed by asking to what extent his reasoning could convince someone who does not yet share his view -- be that person a pacifist, "social contact theorist," Kantian cosmopolitan, or scholar of contemporary international law. We might demand at least some reasons or considerations that make one rethink potential objections to JWT or that help to see some of these problems in a clearer light. I am afraid that Coady's presentation of JWT is not successful in those respects. Although quite a few of his views about twentieth-century warfare are moral commonsense,[1] it is difficult to see their particular connection to JWT. And to the extent that twenty-first-century violence is concerned, I cannot see how his account of JWT is able to address the crucial ethical problems.

In Coady's adaptation the metaethical side of JWT consists of two aspects that abstract from differences between specific proponents of JWT. They are, first, its legacy as a branch of virtue ethics (pp. 1-3) and, second, a commitment to a deontological conception of justice (pp. 15-20). Coady follows the traditional distinction between problems concerning the ius in bello (JIB, Coady’s abbreviation), from those concerning the ius ad bellum (JAB). The first aspect of JWT metaethics guides Coady's conception of JIB as concerning maxims of right or just conduct for individual persons engaged in violent conflict. The second deontological aspect defines the scope of just causes for the use of violence (JAB) for all individuals, not just "princes".

As to JAB, Coady insists that there is only a single just cause for the use of violence, self-defense (including collective self-defense if no other means of self-defense is feasible). He thus endorses a position that in the twentieth century was held to articulate a revolution in international law because it excluded economic, dynastic, and religious reasons that were the subject matter of traditional JAB, as well as "nationalistic" causes, such as protection of national minorities in other states or the prevention of irredentism of non-national minorities within a state's own territory. Current international law prohibits the use of force for any reason other than self-defense that has the status of international ius cogens (see UN Charter, Art. 2[4], and the restriction of the resort to self-defense in Art. 51). This norm, in fact, is widely regarded as a genuine shift in the logic of international law -- rather than an evolution of JWT, as Coady suggests (p. 19) -- and as part of a system of collective security as envisioned in the UN Charter.[2]

Ironically, the recent renaissance of JWT (outside Catholic ethics) seems to be primarily motivated by two conflicts that arise if the prohibition of the use of force is accepted unconditionally. These conflicts, although existing, were peripheral if not irrelevant during the so-called Cold War but came to the foreground in the period since the 1990s and dominate present debates concerning practice and ethical theory.

The first of these conflicts arises from the fact that neither a maxim nor a general legal norm that prohibits the use of force is sufficient to establish peace, or even security, because unilateral peacefulness cannot guarantee that others will refrain from the use of force when it is to their advantage. In conditions of insecurity, therefore, unilateral peacefulness cannot be recommended, because it will be exploited. Liberal theorists, for this reason, follow Hobbes's analysis of the logic of pacification and insist that the establishment and maintenance of reciprocal peace requires an institutional solution -- either in the form of Walzer's "legal paradigm" or of the more ambitious expectations of Kantian cosmopolitans -- that must be allowed to use force or violence in order to enforce compliance to peace-conducive norms.

Although Coady has some sympathy with the permission to punish aggressors (p. 87), his response to Hobbes's challenge consists of two moves. First, he criticizes expansive notions of violence, such as Galtung's, that include all forms of harm and coercion beyond manifest forms of physical violence and psychological torture. Doing so allows him to defend a (negative) ideal of peace that resists the identification of peace with an all-inclusive good that entails neither justice and prosperity as integral parts nor a Christian ideal of religious salvation, as discussed in chapter 12. Instead, what is required for peace is a state of affairs that "quiets the dispositions to violence, hostility and aggression" (p. 269). Such an ideal does not exclude war in cases of self-defense, but it restricts the permissible goals of violent self-defense in accordance with the JW maxim that the purpose of war must be peace. "Just" war, thus, requires methods of warfare and postwar peace settlements that are conducive to promoting peace among the belligerent parties in the future (p. 270ff.).

Second, and more importantly, however, Coady is convinced that the use of violence, even in the case of justified self-defense, "has damaging effects upon those who employ it even if they remain physically unharmed" (p. 42). Given Hobbes's insight that preemptive and preventive uses of violence tend to cause an escalation of hostility rather than ending it, along with the awareness that large-scale violence is hard to control, then the personally damaging effects of the use of violence "make it plausible that resort to violence, even when morally justifiable, should commonly be regarded as a matter for regret" (p. 42, emphasis added).

To summarize: Coady mistrusts institutional solutions in support of justification and instead opts for an ethical approach that articulates norms or maxims of individual conduct.

His appeal to personal concerns about individuals' psychological health and integrity of character reminds the reader of the Socratic thesis that "nobody knowingly acts against what he knows is best for himself". But it does not respond to the problem of reciprocity. It avoids it by confining its attention to individual dispositions. Coady's move, therefore, does not get us out of Hobbes's problem, but rather brings us right back to Hobbes's diagnosis in Leviathan (bk. I, chaps. xi and xiii) that the cause of interpersonal belligerence is not lack of concern with one's own virtue but a lack of trust in others.

In addition, it is doubtful whether Coady's appeal to individual concerns about personal integrity addresses the right level of analysis. The point is far from trivial, because it eliminates institutional agents, such as states and political associations, as potential addressees or subjects of reference in the discussion of war and violence. The focus on individual conduct haunts Coady's discussion of state sovereignty in chapters 4 and 14. It is, in addition, according to Coady's own judgment one of the crucial differences between his own adaptation of JWT and Walzer's marriage of JWT with the "legal paradigm" of the social contract tradition. And finally, addressing individual persons as subjects of JWT is the argumentative basis for Coady's claim that only "just warriors", that is, participants in a just war who fight on the justified side, have a license to kill enemies without being charged with murder (p. 19). On this basis, it is not an individual person's legal or institutional status as "soldier" in an officially declared war that marks the moral difference between killing and murder but the moral justifiability of the use of violence. Such a claim not only conflicts with positive international law but places the responsibility for securing the justice of the resort to violence upon the shoulders of individual soldiers or citizens.

Without doubt, Coady's claim can be seen as a courageous attempt to identify a modern democratic substitute for the traditional addressee of JWT, the "prince" or "king". And it certainly supports those who think that war can be eliminated if people stop participating in it.

But is it really sensible to frame JAB in terms of personal integrity and to transform the responsibility for determining the justice of warfare into a question of individual virtues and vices? Can we really "reduce" decisions and actions that are taken and performed within a complex institutional framework to the actions of individual persons? Surely, it would be a rather radical change of international law as well as JWT to argue that not only "states" but also private persons can declare war. But if such a change is not intended, it must be possible to conceptualize states (or political associations) as legal persons that are not identical with individual persons considered either as private persons or citizens.

True, it would certainly be highly problematic to claim that individual persons do not carry any responsibility for collective political decisions at all or that individual soldiers cannot be held individually responsible for war crimes on the ground that they act on command of their government or superiors. But it is equally problematic to assume that the moral responsibility for collective decisions and institutionalized political actions can be broken down into an aggregation of individual responsibilities for the political outcome and its consequences. Obviously, both the assignment and the assessment of individual responsibility are based on standards and criteria that are quite different from those that are used in the assignment and assessment of responsibility to institutions and collective or legal persons. Separating the two and clarifying the differences between them would certainly contribute to ethical reflection on the use of violence and war. But either Coady is unaware that a problem might lurk in eliminating the level of states (or political associations) or he prefers not to address it.

The second conflict of values arises whenever abstention from violence is not considered to articulate a unique requirement of justice. Since Coady seems to agree that basic human rights of individual persons constitute a valuable source of claims of justice, he faces the problem that the restoration of respect for people's human rights can require the use of force against those who violate them massively. The second conflict is a central issue in Coady's discussion of revolution, terrorism, and humanitarian intervention, which is most closely connected to the discussion of JWT.

Although Coady's position concerning the legitimate status of individuals versus states is rather elusive, he seems willing to admit that it cannot be denied in principle that the use of violence in order to stop violations of basic human rights might be morally justified in some cases if it is the ultima ratio. But he is inclined to consider such cases exceptional in practice.[3] So do liberal cosmopolitans, Michael Walzer, and all other scholars who do not strictly oppose humanitarian intervention, as Coady is ready to concede: when it comes to practice, the differences in opinion might be marginal.

One might, therefore, ask, Why does Coady consider his position as specific for JWT? Since Coady refers the reader to other writings of his own to answer the question rather than tackle it in this volume -- despite its systematic relevance for his claim -- the answer can only be inferred from his rather vague remarks and the final conclusion in chapter 13 that summarizes his reasons for endorsing JWT: In contrast to Walzer and cosmopolitans such as Luban, Coady abstains from treating massive violations of basic human rights as a cause for a conflict of (deontological) norms that might be treated by giving priority either to the principle of nonintervention or to the requirement to respect human rights. Rather, his own position seems to be based on the request that the use of violence must be conducive to promoting the intended end in order to be justified. Since experience so far shows that it can be reasonably doubted that humanitarian intervention is a successful measure for establishing a stable, morally improved status post intervention, the hurdles for humanitarian intervention to be justified are indeed exceptionally high. But they are so for consequentialist reasons.

I largely agree with Coady's diagnosis of what should be the basis of judgments concerning the justifiability of humanitarian intervention, because humanitarian intervention seems adequately described as a measure to counteract injustice committed by parties other than one's own. Regardless of whether the central question of humanitarian intervention is considered to be "Is it permissible?" or "Is it at least a prima facie duty?" no way of counteracting the injustice of others can be considered to constitute an unconditional right or an unconditional duty.

What I don't see is why and how such a diagnosis is especially supported by a commitment to a deontological ethical framework. Quite the contrary, it seems to me to show the very limits of deontology.

As Coady emphasizes in the final chapter, his commitment to exclusively accepting self-defense as a just cause for the use of violence is motivated by his belief that it is a necessary means, and the best means, for preventing abuse in practice. But that -- even if it were true -- cannot be accepted as a metaethical, or even ethical, argument. No theoretical argument can forestall its being abused in practice. More importantly, abuse fortunately does not constitute an ethical problem in practice, because it is, as experience proves, usually quite easy to identify.

The ethical challenge of practice in the twenty-first century arises from the problem of how to react to the increasing number of intrastate violent conflicts. The phenomenology of violence -- and war -- has significantly changed in the last three or four decades. The phenomenon of large-scale violence as we know it from interstate war and the use of weapons of mass destruction, air attacks, and so on are not any longer the unique, and maybe even not the major, cause of human suffering and the physical, psychological, and moral damage that Coady regards as the evil consequence of violence. The contemporary phenomenology of violence is not revolution, and not even terrorism, but low-intensity violence in intrastate conflicts that still increases, while whole states collapse into conditions that de facto resemble Hobbes's hypothetical scenario of the state of nature.

If the damages caused by violence are a moral evil, as Coady claims, then the present situation constitutes an ethical challenge. But Coady's adaptation of JWT seems to lack a systematic framework for addressing the challenge. That is not only the case with respect to JAB but also to JIB. Following the tradition, Coady emphasizes the integrity of noncombatants, who are exactly the group that seems to suffer most from intrastate conflict. According to some statistics that are also quoted by Coady, the number of casualties among noncombatants has increased dramatically in recent decades. The cause, however, is not lack of respect for the status of noncombatants but the changed phenomenology of war,[4] which hardly plays any role in Coady's account of just war theory. Even given an ideal of negative peace, it seems the hexis of a virtuous person in Coady's terms toward contemporary violent conflicts ought to be epoche -- not an easy disposition for ethical theorists.

[1] For Coady's endorsement of commonsense ethics, see p. 17.

[2] Luban's thesis that not only Art. 2(4) but also the so-called Kellogg-Briand Pact that preceded it were primarily a consequentialist response to the bloodshed in World Wars I and II is historically quite convincing. See David Luban, "Just War and Human Rights," Philosophy and Public Affairs 9 (1980), 160-189.

[3] Literally Coady says: "Though Walzer's critics seem to me to be more nearly right about the philosophical issue regarding the nature of state sovereignty, Walzer is nearer to the truth on the pragmatic practical questions" (p. 87).

[4] See e.g. Roland Paris, At War's End: Building Peace after Civil Conflict, Cambridge University Press, 2004.