Morality and the Emotions

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Carla Bagnoli (ed.), Morality and the Emotions, Oxford University Press, 2012, 280pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199577507.

Reviewed by Christopher Bennett, University of Sheffield


Philosophers of mind have been paying increasing attention to the emotions over the past thirty years, and this work inspires and is inspired by developments in ethics. Morality and the emotions seem bound up with one another, but how should we understand the connection? One question that has divided thinkers is whether to see emotions as hindering or enabling our engagement with morality. Answers to this question are likely to depend on one's conception of the emotions, and one's conception of morality, particularly whether one is a cognitivist or non-cognitivist about either or both. This volume comprises new work from philosophers who by and large affirm the important role of the emotions in moral experience, but represent varying traditions ranging from the Humean, through the Kantian to the phenomenological. It also ranges over the role of the emotions in areas such as moral motivation, moral epistemology, identity and moral responsibility. As such it presents a good overview of the fertile work being done in this area at the present time and will be an important resource for those working on the topic.

The collection opens with a good introduction by the editor, setting out the 'retrieval' of the emotions in moral philosophy in response to pioneering work by Bernard Williams and Iris Murdoch, and the range of Humean, Kantian, Aristotelian and other positions that have developed as a result. As well as the introduction, Carla Bagnoli contributes a paper of her own: 'Emotions and the Categorical Authority of Moral Reason.' She argues that experience of moral emotions is constitutive of practical reason, not on grounds that would ground moral reasons in sentiment and hence undermine their categorical authority of moral reasons, but rather precisely because the categorical authority of moral reasons constitutively implies the experience of moral emotions. 'Moral reasons have categorical authority insofar as they are subjectively experienced in the guise of respect' (p. 63). As this language suggests, Bagnoli draws on Kantian inspiration. She argues against the stereotype that Kant sees the emotions as simple non-cognitive sensations: rather, Kant distinguishes various grades of sensibility. Crucially, she argues, Kant gives a central role to emotion, specifically the emotion of respect, in providing a necessary -- for us -- subjective condition of compliance with morality.

Bagnoli helpfully distinguishes three ways in which the emotions might contribute to our moral conduct. Firstly, they might be auxiliary motives, where they add nothing to the force of the moral reason, but give us a motive that reason cannot sufficiently provide in its own right. Secondly, they might act as contributory reasons, where the satisfaction of the emotion itself is something we have reason to bring about, and which therefore helps to tip the balance of reasons in favour of moral conduct. She rejects both of these as interpretations of Kant's view since they both trace our proper compliance with morality to a source external to the categorical authority of the moral reasons themselves. However, a third possibility is that certain subjective conditions are necessary in order for receptivity to the cognitive and motivational force of moral reasons to be realised; furthermore, there is something that, for an embodied being, it feels like to experience the categorical force of the moral law. This seems to be the role Bagnoli gives to respect. This would be compatible with her regarding respect as constitutive of practical reason.

I think it would have been helpful if Bagnoli had said more about the nature of respect. On one reading, respect has an intentional object that explains its phenomenology and motivational potential. This might be that it is directed at something the subject recognises to be sublimely important. Thus the experience of respect is not just, as she points out, the frustration of one's other ends. However, this would be to give what we might call a realist interpretation of the Kantian moral law, emphasising the value of humanity as non-instrumentally valuable. If we seek rather to give it a constructivist interpretation then the idea is not so much that humanity has inherent value but rather that we construct that value on the basis of a procedure that has authority for us -- say the procedure of universalization. On the constructivist interpretation it might be harder to see what the intentional content of respect in a way that will give a satisfactory explanation of its phenomenology as more than just the frustration of desires.

In 'Craving the Right: Emotions and Moral Reasons', Patricia Greenspan develops her previous work on emotions, arguing that emotions do provide what Bagnoli calls contributory reasons. She argues that emotions have satisfaction conditions, and that the failure to satisfy these conditions -- to act in the way the emotions prompt us to act -- causes psychological discomfort. We have reason to relieve this discomfort, and this can provide an important contributory reason. Such contributory reasons can help to back up moral reasons that may already have sufficient authority in their own right. But they also give us specific reasons to act in cases of imperfect obligation where we may have a reason to do something at some point, but no binding reason to do this now. Emotions, Greenspan says, 'help to make the case against moral delay' (p. 40).

Greenspan's is a sophisticated position that starts from the observation that, in many situations, we have rational authority not to act on the balance of best reasons, but rather to set priorities and discount or set aside many reasons. Thus having set the priority of writing this review, I now have the right, rationally speaking, to discount many reasons that may all-things-considered be stronger than the reason I have to continue on with my activity at any given point. It may even be the case that this priority was not the one I had most reason to set. But having set the priority I now have a higher-order reason to set aside these first-order reasons. Emotions, on Greenspan's view, are further higher-order reasons -- reasons not to set aside certain sorts of reasons (reasons, that is, not to put off doing something until later) -- that arise because of the psychological discomfort that putting it off would cause. Given that there are rarely cases in which, when we consider only the strength of the reasons involved, there is a stand-out reason for a particular course of action, it might look as though we need some sort of mechanism by which we are brought to attend -- in a way that might be rationally arbitrary -- to the reasons for some particular action; otherwise, like Buridan's ass, we would never act. Greenspan might be able to apply her case to a whole range of rationally indeterminate situations. However, we might nevertheless wonder whether appeal to emotions and psychological discomfort is necessary to explain our ability to focus in such situations. Why not just say that the ability to focus is to be explained along the same lines as the ability to discount, that it is a feature of recognising the importance of certain ends?

In 'Self-Love and Practical Rationality,' Edward Harcourt argues for a constitutive connection between self-love and practical rationality. Meanwhile, Aaron Ben-Ze'ev explores 'The Nature and Morality of Romantic Compromises,' the strategy of which is to highlight the fact that compromises are both an essential aspect of maintaining valuable relationships while at the same time giving up something of value. He then looks at various styles of compromise that we may make -- for reasons better or worse -- within intense personal relationships.

In 'Values and Emotions: Neo-Sentimentalism's Prospects,' Christine Tappolet defends a version of neo-sentimentalism that she calls 'descriptive' as opposed to 'normative.' She notes that neo-sentimentalism seeks to explain at least some evaluative properties in terms of fitting attitudes. The 'admirable' or the 'disgusting' are features that call for certain responses, and cannot be understood as a class except by virtue of their calling for those emotional responses. As she puts the crucial biconditional: 'x is V if and only if x is such that feeling E is appropriate in response to x.' The normative reading of the biconditional attempts to explain the appropriateness of emotion in terms of some further sense in which an emotion can be required. Tappolet, however, favours the descriptive reading on which the appropriateness of emotion is taken for granted, and the appropriate response is simply the 'correct' one: that is, the one that 'represents things as they are' (p. 119). She thinks that this descriptive reading a) gives a better account of the role of emotion in the explanation of action (and grounds the natural thought that 'values give us reason to act,'), b) avoids the 'wrong kind of reason' objection, and c) is not prey to vicious circularity. This last point can be explained as the worry that her account explains the appropriateness of feeling E by the presence of some evaluative property V, and hence amounts to merely claiming that something has some evaluative property when it has that property. The descriptive account appears to opt out of the project of explaining what it is for something to possess an evaluative property. Tappolet's response to this circularity objection is to point to the epistemic indispensability of emotions in explaining the evaluative concepts.

While Tapplolet seeks to defend the analogy between emotion and perception, Michael Brady ('Emotions, Perceptions and Reasons') seeks to highlight some points of disanalogy. First of all, Brady is concerned that emotions but not perceptions can be seen as 'fast, frugal and relatively indiscriminate' responses to potentially significant features of a situation that a) leave us with an epistemic obligation to look for evidence that confirms the validity of the response, but which at the same time b) shape that search for evidence by 'capturing and consuming' our attention. As I understand him, Brady wants to deny that perceptions can be understood as responses to reasons (or perceptual evidence) at all. Secondly, Brady denies that the experience of emotion is a justifying reason for an evaluative belief: he allows that emotions should be responsive to reasons that count in favour of experiencing those emotions; and that the reasons for the emotions are in themselves reasons for the relevant evaluative beliefs; but concludes from this that the experience of emotion cannot be an additional reason for the evaluative belief beyond the reasons that count in favour of the emotion in the first place. Thus while perceptions are evidence for empirical beliefs, it is the reasons to which emotions respond that are reasons for evaluative beliefs. Emotional experience, unlike perceptual experience, is therefore 'at best a proxy for genuine reasons: useful in those cases where genuine reasons are unavailable to us at the reflective level or in situations where a search for such reasons would be inappropriate' (p. 147).

It seemed to me that in response to Brady's worries, the defender of the perceptual analogy might start by questioning Brady's view of perception, perhaps claiming that the emotional experiences Brady has in mind are analogous to a perceptual 'glimpse' that does indeed call for a search for confirmatory evidence; and that correct perception is more a matter of actively responding to evidence than he allows. She might also point to many cases of emotional experience in which we treat the experience as transparently presenting (and hence tracking) evidence of the presence of the relevant evaluative properties in a manner analogous to perception.

This collection largely concentrates on philosophical rather than empirical-psychological accounts of emotion and morality. However, the latter approach is represented by Paul Thagard and Tracy Finn's account of conscience and moral intuition as a kind of emotional consciousness. One well-known empirical account, that of Shaun Nichols, is criticised in a paper by Laurence Blum. Nichols, Blum argues, operates with an impoverished conception of emotion as occurrent sensation, which leaves out the dimensions of intentionality, cognition and perception, and expressiveness, and that this feeds into a mistaken understanding of empathy as a form of distress at another's distress rather than a way of experiencing their life situation.

In 'Reactive Attitudes Revisited,' John Deigh engages in an argument over the legacy of Strawson's 'Freedom and Resentment.' Deigh argues that two recent influential readings of Strawson by Jay Wallace and Stephen Darwall miss Strawson's key point because they insist on taking 'reactive attitudes' to be responses essentially involving a belief or judgement about the reasons acted upon by rational agents. Deigh takes issue with the cognitivism and rationalism of the Wallace-Darwall interpretation. For Deigh, Strawson sees reactive attitudes as an aspect of our sociability rather than our rationality (p. 213) -- that is, 'plain, natural facts' about our social existence and the goodwill we must defeasibly expect of one another for social interaction to be possible. There are two issues here: one concerns the rational status of the reactive attitudes themselves; the other, the rational status of those to whom we find it inappropriate simply to adopt the 'objective perspective.'

Deigh's questioning of the rational status of the reactive attitudes is familiar from his previous work: that the rationalistic, cognitivist account of emotions will not explain the continuity of adult reactive attitudes with those of, e.g., young children who lack beliefs about reasonable expectation that the Wallace-Darwall account says are necessary. Perhaps the most original argument here denies that Strawson's exclusion of the reactive attitudes on grounds of lunacy and immaturity shows that the intentional object of reactive attitudes is rational agents' responses to reasons: adopting the objective attitude is something we do for many reasons, but basically involves not viewing the person as the object of expectation characteristic of interpersonal relationships; and one cannot infer from the fact that one adopts the objective attitude that one no longer believes that the person is responsive to reasons. The key question for Deigh might have to do with whether Strawson is committed malgré lui to some conception of the reasonableness of expectations of goodwill (e.g. how much help, in what circumstances?) and whether reactions to the failure to meet such expectations do not require responsiveness to reasons both in the subject and object of those reactions.

'Freedom and Resentment' is also the focus for Bennett Helm's 'Responsibility and Dignity: Strawsonian Themes.' And it is the starting-point for Jacqueline Taylor's Humean exploration of the role of moral approval, admiration and pride in the construction of moral agency and identity in 'Moral Sentiment and the Sources of Moral Identity.' Meanwhile Angela Smith considers our responsibility for immoral thoughts as opposed to wrongful actions in 'Guilty Thoughts.' She rejects three objections to responsibility for bad thoughts -- the control objection, the no-harm objection and the psychological health objection (the latter being the claim that it is good for us to have a private inner realm free from the intrusions and demands of social morality). Although expressing sympathy with the virtue-ethical thought that morality involves more than can be captured in a set of obligations, Smith's favoured defence of the aptness of feeling guilty for thoughts involves a development of a contractualist approach to moral demands.

The collection closes with Talbot Brewer's 'On Alienated Emotions.' This paper looks at 'emotional labour' in the modern service economy, whereby workers are increasingly expected to 'act out,' as if sincerely, emotions that they may not actually feel -- in particular, emotions of deference to the customer. It also contains a nice reading of the plight of the butler Stevens in Kazuo Ishiguro's Remains of the Day. Brewer is concerned to capture the harm of such emotional labour by reflecting on the proper role of unalienated emotions in the good human life. He argues that emotions play a pivotal role in the process of 'self-elaboration,' by which human beings 'strive to hone their evaluative outlook so that it tracks genuine goods' (p. 292). It seems to me, however, that this cannot be the whole story, and that a diagnosis of the harm of emotional labour would have to also say something about the expression of emotion: that is, the importance of authenticity or expressive integrity, by which one is not forced to present one's emotions falsely in public situations.