Morality, Competition, and the Firm: The Market Failures Approach to Business Ethics

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Joseph Heath, Morality, Competition, and the Firm: The Market Failures Approach to Business Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2014, 412pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199990481.

Reviewed by Andrew Gustafson, Creighton University


This excellent book is a collection of 13 essays (3 previously unpublished) by Joseph Heath meant to develop a very interesting approach to business ethics rooted in market efficiency. Heath, a philosopher with a firm grasp of economics, here attempts to root business ethics not in controversial political or moral notions of egalitarianism or other such principles, but rather, by determining the conditions which would lead to Pareto-optimal market efficiency -- a state where no person's situation can be improved without harming someone else's situation. (79)

Heath's list of proper business rules may be common to many business ethicists, but the difference here is that if you ask "why should I follow these imperatives?" Heath's answer is not rooted in rights, fairness, the greatest happiness principle, social justice claims, or the categorical imperative. He wants to avoid traditional moral controversies and find the source of these ethical imperatives in the market itself -- the market will work most efficiently when we help prevent market failures, and market failures happen because of these types of imperfections, asymmetries, and externalities. Heath claims that the market needs regulation, but beyond that, individuals and companies need to follow ethical imperatives such as (a) minimize negative externalities, (b) reduce information asymmetries, (c) do not exploit diffusion of ownership, (d) avoid erecting barriers to entry, (e) do not oppose regulation aimed at correcting market imperfections, (f) do not seek tariffs or other protectionist measures and (g) do not engage in opportunistic behavior (37). It is an exciting thesis -- to try to derive business ethics from the pursuit of market efficiency itself, rather than to impose it from everyday morality, which may not always usefully apply to business.

In chapter one Heath criticizes many traditionally held economic views. For example, he points out that profit maximization of the firm actually often goes against self-interest of the manager, although these are often conflated. In criticism of a naïve view of invisible hand power, he points out that self interest alone cannot create optimal market efficiency -- à la Kenneth Arrow, he argues that regulations and other self constraints are needed to prevent information asymmetries, externalization of costs onto others, and other similar market failures that are ultimately inefficient (31). Further, he argues that Milton Friedman, in his focus on free and open markets and fiduciary responsibility, was wrong primarily because he focused only on a limited few of the conditions of Pareto optimal markets. Friedman just didn't take into account other market-failure causing practices.

In chapters 2 and 3 Heath takes on stakeholder theory, because it focuses on the wrong things. He thinks that Enron and other market failures tend to happen not because managers are not watching out for stakeholders, but rather, because they aren't even watching out for stockholders, and there are not sufficient mechanisms in place to ensure proper shareholder control. This, he says, has been lost to most stakeholder theorists, in large part because stakeholder theorists tend to assume that managers and shareholder interests coincide, when in fact they often do not (see Enron). Breakdown of governance is the problem, and it is not just a regulative problem -- it is an internal corporate control issue. Heath is concerned, on the one hand, that stakeholder theory gives managers too much latitude to make decisions that are not clearly profitable or beneficial to the firm (similar to Michael Jensen's criticisms (Jensen 2002)), and could lead to Enron debacles where managers aren't acting for shareholders or stakeholders interests. On the other hand, Heath is concerned that with public goods concerns of stakeholder theory as the goal, stakeholder run corporations will end up with problems endemic of public management (at state-owned enterprises (SOEs)). The key issues he raises for stakeholder theory, which he thinks are parallel to those of SOEs, are that you have too many tasks to achieve and too many principals to follow. In this sense Heath's criticism is very similar to Jensen's (2002). While the parallel between SOEs and stakeholder theory is interesting, I think publicly traded stakeholder managed companies have more clear and immediate accountability than state owned companies traditionally have had.

Chapter 3 is perhaps Heath's clearest explanation of what he means by the market failures approach, as well as why stakeholder theory has serious problems. Among the issues he raises are that for stakeholder theory: there is a 'squeaky wheel' bias (well organized groups will get more say), there are very basic difficulties calculating who is harmed or benefitted and to what extent, there are significant issues regarding management accountability (to whom?), and it seems stakeholder theory replaces any specific fiduciary duty with a general duty to social justice. The market failures approach focuses on market efficiency, which is hindered by market failures. The ethical firm does not seek to profit from market failures; "Profiting from such actions is therefore morally objectionable, not because it violates some duty of loyalty to the customer (as stakeholder theory would have it), but because it undermines the social benefits that justify the profit orientation in first place" (89-90). Again, rather than appeals to moral obligations, or moral rights,

the market failures approach takes its guidance from the policy objectives that underlie the regulatory environment in which firms compete, and more generally, from the conditions that must be satisfied in order for the market economy as a whole to achieve efficiency in the production and allocation of goods and services. (90)

Profit seeking is not the source of unethical behavior -- exploitation of market imperfections is what really causes the trouble. Heath says, "If all companies fully internalized all costs, and charged consumers the full price that the production of their goods imposed upon society, I believe it would be impossible to make the case for any further 'social responsibility' with respect to the environment. (90)" This is a provocative claim, and has a lot of merit.

In chapter 4 Heath argues that everyday morality is inadequate for business, and that most business ethics is useless to business and usually perceived as anti-capitalistic and touchy-feely for a simple reason: business ethicists (especially stakeholder theorists) tend to think competition is somehow immoral because it is adversarial. But healthy markets are competitive, just like a good football game is competitive. Competition requires that you are adversaries with your opponent, at some level, and in such a situation the everyday morality of the golden rule can't apply:

Before kicking in the winning field goal, we do not want football players to be thinking, 'How would I like it if the other team did that to me?' Similarly, before lowering prices, we do not want gas-station owners to be thinking 'How would I like it if the station across the street did that to me?' (102)

But Heath says that adversarialism must not be confused with 'anything goes' (as he thinks David Gauthier and Friedman do (109)). The competitive market will have different rules, but there is still sportsmanship -- not just anything goes. There are constraints, and Heath suggests the following as like rules of sportsmanship for business: (a) don't exploit market failure, (b) do not cheat, (c) do not game the rules, (d) take the high road. This would include refusing to lobby against regulations designed to correct market imperfections (113). Business ethics should not require a company to alter its goals of winning the game, but rather business ethics should be in the business of helping determine what kinds of self-restraining actions are required for Pareto-optimal markets.

In chapter 7 Heath argues that efficiency has within it an implicit non-ideal morality, despite the fact that this seems counterintuitive not only because it rejects altruism, but also because in the market efficiency trumps everyday concerns about fairness or equity. This is because in market transactions, the norm is constrained efficiency, according to Heath. A simple example is hotel rooms which may be triple the price on a busy weekend, not because it is a just price, but because there are people willing to pay that price because it is worth it to them. We also see this with labor wages, where more strenuous or difficult work does not necessarily get more pay. Here an essential point is that everyday morality does not apply well to business, because many principles of everyday morality are anti-capitalist, because they find adversarial competition unethical in everyday life.

After arguing against many normative models for the market, Heath comes down to libertarianism -- which Heath claims is crypto-Paretian anyway -- or Paretian social welfare argument -- that "well-structured, competitive market economy produces not just utilitarian gains (where some might benefit while others lose) but Pareto improvements (where everyone benefits)" (197). Concluding, Heath says, the "Paretian approach to business ethics . . . [is] the most that a normative theory can require without becoming anticapitalist. (200). Norms include prohibitions against exploiting market failures, gamesmanship where you follow the letter of the law but not the spirit of the law, and resisting attempts to do end-runs around regulatory constraints. Self-limiting these behaviors certainly goes "beyond compliance," as he says, and flies in the face of "canonical textbooks on business strategy" (referring to Michael Porter (1990)), which "are basically guides for aspiring executives that focus almost entirely on how to make money by 'creating and sustaining market failures'" (201). Everyday morality is too idealistic and optimistic about reality, says Heath, but a market failures approach provides "a more precise way of articulating the way that normative principles and be weakened, in order to render them more incentive-compatible, without being dissolved entirely. (204). Chapter 8 is devoted to a fruitful discussion of two competing interpretations of the nature and mechanism of how the invisible hand works in markets.

In chapter 9 Heath argues against the view that the central functions of the welfare state are all residual (ensuring property rights, preventing anticompetitive practices, internalizing externalities, etc.) -- which happens to be the view of the right, and also against the view that anything beyond these activities are redistributive in character (which the left thinks is good and the right thinks is bad). Heath wants to argue that there are cooperative arrangements in society that are essential to healthy markets, and government involvement in them is neither residual nor redistributive. Five forms of cooperation he highlights are: economies of scale, gains from trade (in consumption and production), risk pooling, self-binding, and information transmission, in which conflict can arise. State activities that impact these forms of cooperation, though, do not fit neatly into "the 'right-wing' view that political action is dominated by 'rent-seeking behavior, and the 'left-wing' view that the primary function of the welfare state is to secure distributive justice" (255). This is why the welfare state needs to be rethought.

Next in chapter 10, after demonstrating that agency theory is not committed to the doctrine of shareholder primacy, and showing that agency theory cannot permit what is forbidden, but can require what is permitted, Heath wrestles with the question of whether or not agency theory treats all motivation as self-interested. He argues that many agency theorists do downplay the fiduciary obligations of agents (Jensen and William Meckling), or downplay the information asymmetries (Clark), but this is agency theory misconstrued, in Heath's view. He also points out ways some agency theorists crowd out moral incentives. Ultimately, Heath thinks the economic model of rational action is problematic because it "classifies all genuine rule-following as irrational" and "Sophisticated practitioners of agency theory are familiar with these limitations, but a large number of enthusiasts are not" (292). Ultimately, Heath provocatively concludes that, when properly understood and critically used, "Agency theory allows us to see that in many cases, the alternative to ethical business enterprises is not the presence of unethical business enterprises, but rather the absence of any enterprise at all" (292).

In chapter 11, Heath argues that moral motivation comes from psychological, not philosophical sources, and that understanding criminal motivations is more helpful for deterring people from rationalizing bad behavior than teaching philosophy. As he says, "there is no particular reason for business ethics courses to focus on moral dilemmas, or to teach fundamental meta-ethical perspectives (Kantian, utilitarian, etc.)." Students don't act unethically because they don't know the categorical imperative accurately; it is more often because they talk themselves into doing something they otherwise wouldn't through rationalizing. So if that is the case, "a more useful intervention, in an ethics course, would be to attack the techniques of neutralization that students are likely to encounter, and may be tempted to employ, when they go on to their future careers" (320).

Chapter 12 is a sustained criticism of virtue ethics. Heath claims that in the face of criticisms from social psychology, sociology and political theory, the only reason philosophers continue to pursue virtue ethics "is not intellectual heroism, but rather just obstinacy" (323). In short, his argument is that virtue theory, in its focus on character, does not focus enough on real problems of organizational environment that influence behavior. The final chapter, chapter 13, is on reasonable restrictions on underwriting in insurance, and provides a concrete example of how Heath approaches a particular problem using a Pareto approach.

This is an engaging book. In nearly every essay, Heath provides provocative, thoughtful criticisms, which tend to take the road less travelled, and show why the common paths of thought are problematic and fallacious. Heath's arguments are clear but detailed, and for those not well versed in economic theory some sections will take substantial effort, but the fruit of that effort is well worth it.

But there are questions to be raised. First, an obvious question to ask Heath is one about motivation: why would a company care more about maintaining Pareto-optimal efficiency, rather than make more profit within the constraints of the law? I take it that his answer would be that the market failure approach is, at least, not anti-capitalistic in the ways that ethics is. But that doesn't in itself provide motivation to lose money to maintain the Pareto-optimal efficiency. In many respects, this is the question any utilitarian faces when pressed to explain why I should pursue what is in the interest of the many, when it seems to not benefit me personally.

Second, beyond motivation, there is a question of value justification -- although he is a philosopher by training, Heath at times sounds like an economist who finds no value claims in the phrase 'Pareto-optimal' -- but when we determine that under such conditions as "no one could be better off without making someone else worse off", we have assumed what worse off and better off mean, and values are assumed. Is the market failure approach in the end crypto-utilitarian, if the reason for pursuit of Pareto-optimality is that it is in the end best for the overall market (many)? It is hard to pin down what the underlying justification is for the market failures approach other than that it will lead to Pareto-optimal markets in theory, which would provide more balanced outcomes for everyone. There are, it appears at times, smuggled in values of greatest good for the most, justice, and perhaps even fairness, which are the basis for decisions, although they are not explicit.

Third, Heath's criticisms of philosophical theory and suggestion that business ethicists simply focus on psychological rationalizing (why people do wrong when they know what is right) is confusing. Philosophical ethics -- and especially business ethics -- is not designed to teach people to know what is right; rather, it is meant to help people rationally and consistently think through what behaviors and practices should arise from one's values. Paying attention to moral psychology is certainly important, but it is no substitute for (or competitor with) philosophical or applied ethics.

Fourth, it appears that a consequence of Heath's view that anything not leading to Pareto-optimal outcomes is not ethical is that positive externalities of business (which may benefit many unrelated third parties) may in fact be unethical. It is one thing to conclude that excessive pollution is unethical; it is another thing to say that all positive externalities are, but that seems to be the resulting conclusion. Additionally, he is perhaps unfair to virtue ethicists, and the very real concern they have for the effects of community and society on character.

But despite these questions, the book is well worth engaging by anyone interested in economics, agency theory, fiduciary concerns, public policy, corporate governance, and of course, business ethics. Heath is to be commended for this provocative book, explaining a provocative approach to business ethics (market failures approach) that sees as its guiding star the always elusive Pareto-optimal market conditions. I know it has informed my own approach to how I will teach stakeholder theory, theory of the firm, and competition in future courses.