Morality for Humans: Ethical Understanding from the Perspective of Cognitive Science

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Mark Johnson, Morality for Humans: Ethical Understanding from the Perspective of Cognitive Science, University of Chicago Press, 2014, 261pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226113401.

Reviewed by Alexa Forrester, Santa Rosa Junior College


Mark Johnson's newest book is a welcome renewal and defense of John Dewey's ethical naturalism, which Johnson claims is the only morality "fit for actual human beings." (217) The book straddles the divide between questions in moral psychology -- What values do we have? Where did they come from? What role does reason play in moral deliberation? -- and questions of normative and metaethics -- From where do values get genuine normative authority? How do we properly rank our values when they compete with each other? These questions weave together throughout the book; I will treat them in turn.

Regarding moral psychology, it is safe to say that the Deweyan picture of human agency, which Johnson draws on heavily, has been vindicated by contemporary empirical research. In Chapters 2-4, Johnson presents multiple leading theories of moral psychology,[1] all of which support Dewey's general insights about human nature, including: we are mostly creatures of unreflective habit, our values are plural and irreducible to one fundamental value, we begin our lives with general motivational impulses that get shaped and refined by our environments, and these culture-shaped habits often come into conflict.

Johnson endorses the idea, now popular among moral psychologists, that we have the capacity to make fast, arational moral snap-judgments and also the capacity to rationalize these judgments after the fact with moral reasoning. But he also argues that moral psychologists overlook an essential Deweyan insight: there is another source of moral judgment, one that is central to understanding our moral agency. Johnson writes,

I am going argue that there is . . . a key role for a process of moral deliberation that is more than just intuitive, nonconscious judgment, and also more than mere after-the-fact justification by principles. It is a reflective process of deliberation concerning which possible course of action available in a given morally problematic situation would best harmonize competing impulses, values, and ends. (90)

One might worry that the process described here is really just means-end deliberation and so not strictly normative judgment at all. But Johnson counters that during such deliberation, it is the ends themselves that need to be refined and reconceived, so characterizing this as means-end deliberation is simply false. Reason's job is more than just getting us what we want. When our passions -- needs, desires, values, hopes, etc. -- are in overt conflict, we literally cannot proceed until reason-guided imagination allows us to reorder and harmonize those passions. We need reason to settle our ends. (136) This third element of moral judgment has been largely absent from discussions in moral psychology, and Johnson rightly places it at the center of his picture of moral agency.

Another key psychological conclusion Johnson defends is that there is no specifically moral faculty, including no universal moral grammar, as some contemporary theorists have claimed. Chapter 6 includes a lengthy discussion of the popular analogy between linguistic syntax and moral syntax, highlighting the various reasons we ought to be cautious when employing it. The chapter also includes a potent criticism of Marc Hauser's recent notion of a 'moral faculty'. (146-150) Johnson concludes that, "Instead of our having evolved a distinct moral instinct or faculty, it is far more likely that we have recruited a large number of preexisting systems for addressing the kinds of problems we tend to call 'moral problems'." (149)

By juxtaposing Dewey's writings with those of contemporary moral psychologists, Johnson establishes that Dewey's early 20th century moral psychology was well ahead of the curve, and that a Deweyan conception of our moral faculties is well-supported by current evidence. So what of the normative and metaethical theses defended in the book? Johnson writes, by way of transition:

Once we see how our values arise naturally . . . . our central question will then become how we ought to decide, in particular situations, which values should take priority, especially in the face of potentially multiple values in any given situation that either (a) might conflict with other values we hold or (b) might conflict with values held by other people. That, I submit, is the real moral problem for most of us. It is an issue about the nature of good moral deliberation . . . (72)

To those like me who have spent considerable effort defending a similar approach to ethics, such a clear and succinct framing of the normative project is a welcome starting point. And the simple fact that Johnson has set this particular stage is to his credit. Unfortunately, the normative and metaethical answers Johnson gives to this question are not entirely successful, both in that they are not always clear, and when they are clear, they are less than persuasive.

Johnson's normative approach requires us to give up on two normative ideas that have long dominated Western philosophy: (1) that right or good action should be defined as adherence to some universal and unrevisable principle or set of principles, and (2) that moral deliberation's proper function should be to correctly apply these universal principles to our particular situations. He devotes many pages to criticizing particular instantiations of these ideas, including traditional Kantian perspectives (41-47), "moral law folk theory" (16, 24-25, 177), and, briefly, traditional consequentialism[2] (189). He also rejects the existence of any "self-evident" moral facts, as G.E. Moore, and more recently, Russ Shafer-Landau, have posited. (180-188)

Johnson hopes we will follow his lead and replace these ideas with the acceptance that new and better moral principles can be the outcome of moral deliberation, that is, be generated by -- rather than discovered through or applied within -- deliberation. Whenever a conflict in values arises, deliberation begins. And when deliberation concludes with a reconceived notion of the ends worth pursuing, we thereby begin an on-going experiment in testing the mettle of this new value structure. Johnson writes,

The test of a process of moral deliberation is not whether it conforms to some allegedly pre-given foundational facts, but instead whether and how well it resolves a problematic situation . . . . Principles are experimental hypotheses to be tested by actual moral inquiry, to determine if and how they help us find a good resolution to the problem. (187-188)

Of course, the idea that our values -- and the deliberative processes that shape them -- should be tested in practice is empty as a normative ethic if there are no standards upon which to judge what counts as a successful versus unsuccessful test. Here the notion of reasonable versus unreasonable deliberation steps in to do the normative heavy lifting, as witnessed in the following passages:

What we ought to do is a question of what is reasonable. (133)

A deliberative process is reasonable when it actually gives us a sense of resolution of conflicting ends and values. (193)

A reasonable choice . . . is one that finds a way to harmonize to a certain degree the competing values we entertain. (114)

The test of a process of moral deliberation is not whether it confirms to some allegedly pre-given foundational facts, but instead whether and how well it resolves a problematic situation . . . Principles are experimental hypotheses to be tested by actual moral inquiry, to determine if and how they help us find a good resolution to the problem. (187-188)

The metaethical claim here is that normative principles accrue genuine authority not by corresponding to some mind-independent moral facts, but rather by enabling, in an on-going and time-tested manner, a harmonious interface between individual and environment, where the environment includes social and cultural expectations.

Given this metaethical stance, it is not surprising that Johnson offers few general normative conclusions, for all norms are subject to potential revision. Johnson writes, "We can describe how we ought to deliberate, but we cannot say, in advance, what the outcome of any such deliberation ought to be." (213) But, of course, prescribing how we ought to deliberate is itself a normative matter. And Johnson is not shy about insisting that there is a right and a wrong way to go about it. In Chapter 7 he argues that moral fundamentalism is immoral precisely because it threatens skillful deliberation, and in Chapter 8 he champions the ideal of conscientious deliberation. His attempts to support these normative conclusions are the weakest points in his book. Let me consider each in turn.

Johnson defines moral fundamentalism as "the doctrine that there exist foundational moral truths that take the form of either absolute, unconditional, universal binding moral laws or a set of absolute and foundational moral facts." (164) Clearly Johnson's account of human values entails that fundamentalism, so defined, is false. But he also claims it is immoral. To defend this normative claim in a manner consistent with his own metaethics, he must therefore demonstrate that fundamentalism actually subverts effective deliberation and reasonable conduct. But is it true that fundamentalists, as they stick doggedly to their false beliefs, can never sufficiently thereby resolve their problems?

Imagine an Amish fundamentalist who decides, because she believes it is God's will, to forever exile her son because he has broken his faith. At first she experiences this as extremely painful, but her community supports her decision, and she eventually overcomes her feelings of loss. In fact, in the long run, she experiences her decision as more meaningful precisely because it was emotionally trying. What would Johnson say of her conduct? Would he insist that even though she feels fulfilled, she isn't really? This response is unacceptably presumptuous. Perhaps instead he would insist that there was some conduct that would have been more harmonious, and her failure to consider that option was her moral shortcoming. But her choice proved harmonious enough for her, and Johnson is in no position to insist that maximizing harmony rather than simply achieving a satisfactory level of harmony is an important deliberative ideal. Would he try to point out that while the mother's problems were resolved, her son's problems were not, and that is where fundamentalism has failed her? This response can't succeed in Johnson's framework, since the mother has successfully tested the norm that her son's problems are no longer her responsibility.[3] A reader is left wanting to know what Johnson would say about such potential counterexamples to his claim that fundamentalism impedes reasonable conduct.

In addition to maintaining that fundamentalism is immoral, Johnson also offers a normative ideal, which he calls conscientiousness. He writes:

The kind of person we should aspire to become is a conscientious person. This is the opposite of a dogmatic mind that . . . treats moral thinking as rule mongering. . . .  Conscientiousness, by contrast, requires the mental and emotional flexibility to imagine new solutions and new ways of going forward that resolve pressing moral problems. (216)

Here it is worth noting that Johnson fails to distinguish two moral vices: dogmatism (an inflexible unwillingness to question ones current norms) and ethical provincialism (an overly narrow sense of who matters morally-speaking). But these two vices come apart. For example, a newly radicalized Arizona tea partier, who has thrown off a generations-old tradition of tolerance towards immigrants, and who is now experimenting with the idea that immigrant refugees are not our country's responsibility, is non-dogmatically becoming more rather than less provincial. When Johnson defines conscientiousness in opposition to dogmatism, does he also mean it to oppose ethical provincialism?

This unanswered question matters because most of the conduct we are likely to judge morally atrocious -- genocide, mass oppression, sexual abuse, factory farming -- results not from dogmatism (factory farming is a very recent innovation), but rather because those in power care too little for the concerns of those they harm. Consider, for example, the case of the gangster Anwar Congo, who led death squads in Indonesia in 1965-66. Congo and his collaborators didn't just get away with slaughtering hundreds of thousands, they made what Johnson might call a practice of it. [4] Further, these men were and continue to be celebrated for their innovations in killing.[5]

Notice, the norms these men adopted in response to their environments, including the belief that they should execute millions, worked out really well for them, delivering them not only personal satisfaction, but societal respect, and ongoing material wealth. By Johnson's definition of reasonable conduct, it seems like these men have lived as they should. So, one will wonder, does his theory have any resources for supporting the judgment that what these men have done is profoundly immoral?

Johnson specifically denies that there is any a priori or absolute answer to the question of who we are obligated to consider in our moral deliberations. He writes, "There can be no algorithm for determining when the circle of relevant interlocutors and affected parties has been drawn broadly enough, because where that line is drawn is itself the subject of ongoing evaluative/normative debate." (127) But, then, haven't these killers demonstrated by testing their values in practice, that, in certain types of societies, it is reasonable to become a killer? The capacity for systematically discounting the problems of others is just as human as the capacity for empathy. And if employing this provincialism can help us lead (what to us feel like) prosperous lives, isn't doing so moral or at least reasonable by Johnson's own lights?

The point in the book where Johnson seems closest to acknowledging and responding to this challenge is when he introduces Colin Koopman's formulation of it: "Although Dewey devoted hundreds of pages to the genesis of solutions, he hardly ever wrote about the genesis of problems. . . .  What about situations where no conflict is felt or perceived by the dominant social group? What about racism?" (105) Koopman's point is that, in practice, certain types of value structures, like racism, often serve those in power well. And this being the case, it seems like Dewey would be forced to commend them. Unfortunately, Johnson's response to Koopman is inadequate. He writes, "I see no reason to think that Dewey would not have welcomed" challenges to status-quo power structures, and "Dewey was actually one of the better practitioners of . . . inquiry into the norms and assumptions underlying our inherited conceptual frameworks." (106-107) But this response clearly misses the mark. The question is not whether Dewey himself was progressive, though I agree he was. Rather, the question is whether Dewey's theory required him to be so.

It is possible that Johnson intends for the ideal of conscientiousness to keep us from concluding that conduct like Congo's is moral. Elaborating on the notion of conscientiousness, he writes that it "seeks the most comprehensive survey of conflicting ends, values, and principles, and it then strives for the most comprehensive resolution available within the situation as we currently understand it." (219) So perhaps a conscientious deliberator not only eschews dogmatism, but also seeks the widest, least provincial stance possible. Was Congo's moral failing that he was not conscientious enough?

But then notice the predicament Johnson is in: either conscientiousness is an aim internal to all deliberation or it is one of many different deliberative principles that we can experiment with and discount when unhelpful. If Johnson believes concientiousness is an aim internal to deliberation, he has offered no plausible argument for this.[6] If, on the other hand, he thinks that conscientiousness is subject to testing in action, then he is welcome to report, in the spirit of ethical empiricism, that conscientiousness has worked well as an ideal in his community. But he has no grounds upon which to conclude that Anwar Congo has done anything wrong. Sure, Congo's actions don't live up to our standards, but our standards aren't on his radar, and he has no obligation to put them there. Worse, he has no obligation to put the suffering of his victims on his radar either.

In an unfortunate straw man, Johnson characterizes his detractors as worried that "any and everything is permitted" on his approach. (168) But I'm not worried about any and everything. I'm worried about Anwar Congo. If Johnson's approach entails that Congo's conduct is moral, this is reason enough to be hesitant. It is a shortcoming that Johnson offers no sustained response to this challenge. For example, he might have devoted a chapter, rather than insufficient paragraphs here and there, to explaining whether and how his theory can support the judgment that the powerful are obligated, even when doing so will create problems for themselves, to attend to the problems of those they oppress.

Let me end with a related frustration. Johnson claims throughout the book that it is an unjustified fear of moral chaos that keeps people from taking his approach seriously. (1, 124, 133, 163-168) But this oft-repeated diagnosis, in addition to being uncharitable and in many cases false, is also a red herring. It distracts from the fact that Johnson lacks a clear and well-defended answer to a basic moral question: When Anwar Congo executed 1000 people, did he err morally-speaking? And if so, what was the nature of his error? I suspect Johnson could mount a satisfactory response to such questions, but he hasn't done it here. In any case, I contend it is this gap in Johnson's theory, rather than their own fear of moral chaos, that makes ethicists hesitant about the promise of his approach.

In short, as far as normative and metaethical questions are concerned, Johnson devotes too many pages to defeating his easier enemies (Kant, moral folk theorists, etc.) without sufficiently addressing the most significant obstacle to Deweyan ethical naturalism. The good news is that he has set the stage for a promising dialogue, and we can look forward to his future contributions to the conversation.

[1] These include the theories of Antonio Damasio, Marc Hauser, Jonathan Haidt, Patricia Churchland and others.

[2] Johnson concedes that more recent forms of “dynamic consequentialism” may be immune to these criticisms.

[3] I'm planning to discuss this particular counterintuitive result, which I call the “externalization” worry, at length in a paper “Whose Problems are My Problems?”

[4] Johnson uses Alasdair MacIntyre’s notion of practice (see 31-32).

[5] For evidence of this, see the 2012 documentary “The Act of Killing” (directed by Joshua Oppenheimer), and the subsequent accounts of how Anwar Congo has reacted to its release.

[6] While he has established in Chapter 4 that restoring action is an aim internal to deliberation, he has not established that doing so conscientiously is as well.