Morality from Compassion

Morality From Compassion

Ingmar Persson, Morality from Compassion, Oxford University Press, 2021, 145pp. $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192845535.

Reviewed by Colin Marshall, University of Washington, Seattle


In his most recent book, Ingmar Persson engages with a cluster of issues connected to compassion. His discussion throughout engages with the views of Arthur Schopenhauer. The book is therefore similar in some respects to P.F. Strawson’s classic 1966 book on Kant, The Bounds of Sense (Strawson 1966). As Strawson did with Kant, Persson takes Schopenhauer to be a direct interlocutor, one who is wrong on some points and broadly right on others. Persson engages somewhat more with the relevant secondary literature than Strawson did, but the primary audience for the book are contemporary ethicists in the Parfitian tradition (especially those familiar with Persson’s earlier work), not Schopenhauer scholars. As someone who has also attempted to bring Schopenhauer more into contemporary conversations, I appreciated Persson’s overall approach.

Persson’s book consists of five chapters on interrelated themes. There is no shortage of philosophical argumentation, but Persson’s style is generally exploratory, so what emerges is more of a general picture than a single argumentative thread. In what follows, I summarize some of the main claims from each chapter, and conclude with some critical comments.

In the first chapter, Persson considers Schopenhauer’s fundamental moral principle: to injure no one, but rather to help as much as you can. Persson asks what, on Schopenhauer’s principle, one should do when maximally helping requires harming another. He speculates that Schopenhauer might say that (at least for agents with high levels of compassion) the imperative to help justifies some forms of injury. Schopenhauer takes compassion to be the sole basis of morality, and calls the compassionate resistance to injuring others “justice” (Gerechtigkeit). Against this, Persson argues that our sense of justice is distinct from compassion, whether or not justice is understood in terms of desert, rights, or equality. Persson also offers his preferred understanding of compassion, in terms of sympathy with others’ negative states—a sympathizing that is often, but not always, accompanied by a benevolent desire to help, where this desire is the genuine moral motivator. Persson considers the contrast between benevolence and malice, and disagrees with what he takes to be Schopenhauer’s view that the former involves a more complex representational content than the latter, namely, an element of identification with the other. Instead, Persson argues, benevolence can be triggered just by imagining another’s suffering, whereas malice requires antecedently disliking something about the other.

The theme of identification is central to the book’s second chapter, which draws on Derek Parfit’s classic discussions of personal identity (Parfit 1986). Schopenhauer claims that (non-ascetic) concern for oneself is the hallmark of egoism, and (non-malicious) concern for others is the hallmark of compassion. Against Schopenhauer, Persson argues that we could have psychological successors (e.g., future people who inherit one brain hemisphere) that are not ourselves, but with whom our relations are non-moral. Persson suggests that the key dividing line between the moral and non-moral is not personal identity, but instead whether we imaginatively access another’s states ‘from the inside’, which constitutes “an imaginative extension of our introspective access to our current experiences” (38). These successors’ wills would also, Persson claims, be largely dependent on ours, which would preclude reasons of justice from applying to relations to them. Persson then turns to Schopenhauer’s radical claim that a deep metaphysical unity underlies compassion, a claim that he finds “downright incomprehensible” (56). Even if there were such unity, Persson argues, so long as it did not involve the unity of different subjects’ consciousnesses, it would not explain how their feelings could be conducted in the way that Schopenhauer envisions happening in compassion. Persson considers Sandra Shapshay’s reading that Schopenhauer’s view instead rests on an appeal to inherent value (something with no strong metaphysical implications), and rejects it on textual grounds. He suggests, though, that, contra Schopenhauer, no ambitious metaphysics or appeal to value is needed to explain compassion, and that, instead, merely imagining another’s suffering could itself generate a motivation to alleviate it.

The third chapter focuses on Jesse Prinz’s and Paul Bloom’s well-known objections to basing morality on empathy (Prinz 2011; Bloom 2016), and touches on Schopenhauer’s discussion of self-renunciation. Persson takes issue with some relatively minor points in Prinz’s and Bloom’s discussions (such as whether they adequately distinguish empathy from emotional contagion), but ultimately ends up with a similar view. Persson agrees with Prinz and Bloom that our spontaneous empathetic tendencies are morally biased, just as our spontaneous prudential tendencies are problematically biased towards the near-future. He proposes that morality should instead be based on ‘reflective empathy’, where the motivational benefits of empathy are directed by the deliverances of reason. The deliverances of reason, on Persson’s view, are quite strong: he writes, e.g., that “practical rationality requires us to take into account all temporal facts that might have a bearing on our attitudes” (94). Continuing this line of thought, Persson considers what the motivational impact is of ‘zooming out’, considering ourselves as tiny specks in the vast universe. Such considerations, he claims, diminish our amount of willing, especially our self-concern. He disagrees with Schopenhauer, however, that a larger view such as this can itself negate our willing entirely. Persson also argues that while the most plausible way to situate Schopenhauer’s doctrine of self-renunciation in the context of his ethics would be to take self-renunciation to reduce the amount of will, Schopenhauer’s own metaphysics rules out this possibility, leaving his doctrine generally mysterious.

In Chapter 4, Persson turns towards the topic of negativity bias—that is, whether we have more moral reason to be concerned with others’ negative states (like pains) than with their positive states (like pleasures). After briefly registering his disagreement with Schopenhauer’s view that positive states exist only as the disappearance of negative feelings, Persson shifts to his main topic, debunking the intuition that “there is more of a moral reason to reduce what is intrinsically bad for individuals than to increase to an equal extent what is intrinsically good for them” (109). Persson argues that this intuition is misguided, strictly speaking, though a weaker, more general principle might be defensible. The reason why the weaker principle is defensible, on Persson’s view, is that negative states like pains often register the threat of a permanent loss of some vital capacity, whereas positive states almost never register the possibility of any comparable permanent gain. Hence, he suggests, evolutionary pressures may have made our compassionate tendencies more sensitive to negative states than to positive ones even though, strictly speaking, there is nothing intrinsically more morally significant about negative states than positive ones.

The fifth and final chapter considers whether the fact that moral norms are demanding and require significant self-sacrifices is an objection against them. Persson argues that, while consequentialism is often seen as a more demanding moral theory than others, other theories can be more demanding for some individuals in some circumstances. For example, a deontological ethics could demand the repayment of a loan even when this would generate significant hardship for the debtor and no significant benefit to anyone else. With an eye towards Schopenhauer’s doctrine of our unchanging but noumenal (and so therefore hidden) moral characters, Persson then argues that a moral norm can maintain its grip on us so long as we are not aware of anything stopping us from satisfying it.

There was much in Persson’s discussions that I found compelling, or at least well worth wrestling with. In particular, as someone who (independently of Schopenhauer interpretation) has tried to make sense of the intuitive moral asymmetry between suffering and happiness, I found the fourth chapter particularly insightful and challenging. I will, however, close with four more critical comments.

First: while engaging with extant Schopenhauer scholarship is not essential to Persson’s main aims, Schopenhauer scholars may find themselves frustrated at how often Persson’s comments either rest on questionable readings of Schopenhauer, or else echo claims that are already in the secondary literature. To be fair, Persson mentions some relevant commentaries (such as Magee 1997, Cartwright 2012, and Shapshay 2019), though he does not mention other key Anglophone commentaries, (such as Atwell 1990; 1995). When he does, though, it is more in the key of noting general points of similarity than of engaging with what others have done. Persson’s most sustained engagement is with Shapshay’s ‘axiological’ reading of Schopenhauer metaethics, but his objection to that reading (namely, that it is hard to reconcile with various passages) ignores Shapshay’s broader “two Schopenhauers” interpretive hypothesis, according to which Schopenhauer had several, competing strains of thought.

Second: Persson also largely ignores the recent literature on the moral psychology of compassion or empathy. Prinz’s and Bloom’s objections to empathy have attracted plenty of critical commentary already, which Persson does not acknowledge. Moreover, his distinction between imagining ‘from the inside’ vs. ‘from the outside’, as well as his suggestions that empathetic imagining can itself generate an altruistic motivation and that reason itself can motivationally correct empathy, are made without apparent awareness of the voluminous literature concerning these topics. Moral psychologists, like Schopenhauer scholars, may therefore find themselves occasionally frustrated.

Third: Persson does not acknowledge Schopenhauer’s deep anti-intellectualism, which struck me as a missed opportunity. For instance, Schopenhauer would arguably agree with Persson about the incomprehensibility of how the noumenal, undivided will makes compassion possible. Schopenhauer holds that rational intelligibility (as governed by the principle of sufficient reason) is limited to the phenomenal realm, after all, though he allows for some sort of non-rational metaphysical explanation that goes beyond that. Schopenhauer likewise denies that reason can correct compassion, and so would surely be suspicious of Persson’s moral psychology in the same way that he was suspicious of Kant’s.

Finally: Persson’s arguments employ the traditional method of (hypothetical) cases and speculative considerations concerning evolutionary psychology. While this methodological approach has its attractions, a contrast with Schopenhauer’s methodology may be instructive. Now, Schopenhauer does occasionally make use of thought experiments and quasi-evolutionary considerations and so might sympathize with some aspects of Persson’s approach. Schopenhauer’s core methodology, however, is quite different from Persson’s. Schopenhauer claims that while some philosophers (in particular, Kant) start with “mediated, reflective cognition”, he starts with “immediate and intuitive cognition” (WWR1 2: 537; see also Guyer 1999). Schopenhauer thus puts most of his philosophical stock in direct reflection on our lived experiences, as opposed to conceptual analysis, judgments made in response to hypothetical cases, or speculations about our species’ historical development. I therefore suspect that Schopenhauer would see Persson’s methodology as largely misguided. That is not to say that Schopenhauer’s methodology is correct, but it may have a stronger prima facie claim to be grounded in reality than Persson’s, even if Schopenhauer’s conclusions will strike some philosophers as less plausible than Persson’s.

In sum, Persson’s admirably concise book offers interesting arguments on a range of issues connected to compassion and empathy. It is especially recommended for readers familiar with Persson’s earlier work, and for contemporary ethicists in the Parfitian tradition who are open to welcoming a less familiar historical interlocutor.


Atwell, John E. 1990. Schopenhauer: The Human Character. Temple University Press.

———. 1995. Schopenhauer on the Character of the World: The Metaphysics of Will. University of California Press.

Bloom, Paul. 2016. Against Empathy: The Case for Rational Compassion. New York, NY: Ecco.

Cartwright, David. 2012. “Schopenhauer on the Value of Compassion.” In A Companion to Schopenhauer, edited by Bart Vandenabeele, 249–65.

Guyer, Paul. 1999. “Schopenhauer, Kant, and the Methods of Philosophy.” In The Cambridge Companion to Schopenhauer, edited by Christopher Janaway, 93–137. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Magee, Bryan. 1997. The Philosophy of Schopenhauer. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Parfit, Derek. 1986. Reasons and Persons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Prinz, Jesse J. 2011. “Is Empathy Necessary for Morality?” In Empathy: Philosophical and Psychological Perspectives, edited by Amy Coplan and Peter Goldie, 211–29. Oxford University Press.

Shapshay, Sandra. 2019. Reconstructing Schopenhauer’s Ethics: Hope, Compassion, and Animal Welfare. Oxford University Press.

Strawson, P. F. 1966. The Bounds of Sense: An Essay on Kant’s “Critique of Pure Reason.” Methuen.