Morality in the Philosophy of Thomas Hobbes: Cases in the Law of Nature

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S. A. Lloyd, Morality in the Philosophy of Thomas Hobbes: Cases in the Law of Nature, Cambridge UP, 2009, 419pp., $93.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521861670.

Reviewed by Matthew Noah Smith, Yale University


Sharon Lloyd's bold and engaging new book Morality in the Philosophy of Thomas Hobbes: Cases in the Law of Nature is an important companion to her wonderful first book, Ideals as Interests in Hobbes's Leviathan. In the new book, Professor Lloyd presents and defends an exciting and novel interpretation of Hobbes's moral and political theory. Hobbes scholars will no doubt spill much ink critiquing the unorthodox readings of many famous passages and the quite bold overall interpretation of Hobbes's moral and political theory found in the book. But, because I am not a Hobbes specialist, this review shall not assess the accuracy of Lloyd's exegesis. Instead, this review will contain first-order philosophical engagement with the central project Lloyd imputes to Hobbes. This project is the construction of a meta-normative theory, which Lloyd calls the reciprocity theory of reason. This theory is meant both to ground the authority of and generate content for the Laws of Nature. Hopefully, my focus on theory instead of exegesis will help to clarify Lloyd's account of Hobbes's moral and political theory. This may be especially appropriate given that Lloyd ends the book by arguing for the contemporary relevance of Hobbes's philosophical positions.

Traditionally -- and especially for the past two generations -- Hobbes scholars have attributed to Hobbes a brutally simplistic emotivism: being good just is being desired, and one has a reason to j just in case (more or less) j-ing satisfies a desire. In light of this, one needn't -- and many haven't -- read Hobbes as an egoist. For, one can desire other people's welfare. One would thereby see another's welfare as good and therefore see promoting the other's welfare as a reason to act. So, Hobbes is no egoist. But, even though one implausible result is avoided, the simple emotivism most Hobbes scholars attribute to Hobbes is itself incredible. Consequently, readers of the traditional interpretations of Hobbes may quite correctly lodge foundational objections on the basis of the absurdity of Hobbes's purported meta-normative commitments. This is especially the case given that Hobbes is a rigorously systematic theorist. By Hobbes's very own lights, if the foundations of his theory are flawed, then the entire theory fails to get off the ground. Those interested in Hobbes but uninterested in pure exegesis are thereby immediately driven to a reconstructive project like Gregory Kavka's: develop a Hobbesian moral and political theory while eschewing Hobbes's moral and political theory.

The central claim of Lloyd's book is a response to this kind of pessimism about Hobbes's moral and political theory, and it is a truly audacious claim: Thomas Hobbes has a heretofore unrecognized and philosophically respectable meta-normative theory, a theory Lloyd calls the reciprocity theorem of reason (hereafter RT). The RT explains normativity in terms of certain inescapable demands of agency and it gives the contents of practical reasons, and the contents of the Laws of Nature in particular, by way of a construction procedure involving idealized reciprocal judgments of blamelessness. In short, Lloyd argues that Hobbes offers what we today call a constitutivist grounding of the authority of reason and a constructivist theory of the content of morality. As I said: Lloyd's reading of Hobbes is truly audacious.

The RT makes its appearance in an argument that spins out what it means for a being to be a rational animal (pp. 219-220). First, if a being is a rational animal, then it behaves in accordance with right reason. This is not mere accidental conformity, but is instead a matter of acting on a practical reason. Lloyd leaves aside the question of how something acts on some consideration or other -- Hobbes never discusses this question -- and instead focuses exclusively on what sort of thing a practical reason is. Presumably, once that is spelled out, it will be unproblematic to give an account of what it is to act on practical reasons, which in turn will give us an account of what it is for a being to be a rational animal. So all the work is done by the account of what it is to be a practical reason. The RT supposedly does that work.

The RT as formally stated by Lloyd is as follows:

If one judges another's doing of an action to be without right, and yet does that action oneself, one acts contrary to reason… . That is, to do what one condemns in another is contrary to reason. (p. 220, italics removed)

Right off the bat, let us note that Lloyd initially describes the RT as a constraint on reason. This though is quite incorrect (Lloyd seems to recognize this when she later explains that she is "unfolding the conception of reason Thomas Hobbes takes to be the common understanding of his time, and the conception underlying the natural law tradition that he insists he is illuminating." [p. 223]). For, constraints on what reason can require cannot alone yield fully determinate contents of reasons or, for that matter, rational requirements. But, the RT is supposed to yield just such fully determinate contents of reasons and the Laws of Nature. So, the RT is more than a mere constraint; it is a substantive account of what reason requires.

The basic idea behind the RT is that the contents of practical reasons are determined primarily by the interaction of the following things: a certain reactive attitude, namely blame, a consistency requirement, and a consideration-action pair {R, φ}. In particular, a consideration R in favor of φ-ing is a reason to φ if {R, φ} can, without contradiction, be a part of a perfectly consistent practice of not blaming people for φ-ing for the sake of R. If one sincerely blames some people for φ-ing on the basis of R but (in all sincerity) does not blame others (e.g., like himself), then R is either not a reason to φ or, more likely, one is being criticizably inconsistent in not recognizing that others are acting on legitimate reasons. We would distinguish between these two judgments as follows: if there is not a perfectly consistent practice of not blaming people for φ-ing for the sake of R, then R is not a reason to φ; if there is a perfectly consistent practice of not blaming people for φ-ing for the sake of R, then one is being criticizably inconsistent.

Perhaps what is most initially striking about this is the role that reactive attitudes play in this account. Lloyd is quite up front about this: "only one's own judgments of blameworthiness can provide one with reasons" (p. 227). Although this retains certain features of the traditional emotivist reading of Hobbes, a reactive attitudes-based meta-normative theory is highly sophisticated. Consequently, this reading of Hobbes may seem anachronistic to some Hobbes scholars (especially since many may think that it strays quite far from the texts), but in my opinion there is much about this reading that creatively and charitably captures the spirit of the more familiar accounts of Hobbes's views.

All this being said, the reactive attitudes are not in fact what are at the heart of Lloyd's account of the RT. Lloyd writes that one has "nothing that counts as a reason at all unless it is a justifying consideration [one] would be willing not just to give to others but also to accept from them as justifying their like conduct." (p. 227) Lloyd recognizes that the mere invocation of reactive attitudes is not enough to keep a meta-normative theory of practical reason from collapsing into a kind of subjectivism -- in this case actual dispositions to blame entirely determining the content of practical reasons -- that has already been rejected as overly simplistic. Charity, at least, requires that we read Hobbes as having more to say about the source of practical reasons. And the consistency requirement is that something more, for it blocks an utterly subjective and consequently utterly implausible meta-normative theory. It does this by grounding reasons to j not in actual dispositions to blame, but instead in consistent dispositions to blame. In particular, regardless of whether one is disposed to accept from another some consideration as rendering blameless (i.e., as justifying) that other person's action, so long as one demands from others that they treat that consideration as rendering blameless one's own action, one thereby commits oneself to accepting that consideration as a justification from others. While this is not quite enough to generate a practical reason -- {R, φ} must bear the appropriate rational connection with one another -- it is this consistency requirement that does most of the theoretical heavy lifting.

This is also from whence the reciprocity of the RT comes. Reciprocity exists when some person, A, would both expect others to accept R as justifying his own φ-ing, and would accept from others R as justifying their own φ-ing. But, Lloyd argues, so long as A expects others to accept R as justifying his φ-ing, consistency requires that A accepts from others R as justifying their φ-ing. Why? Apparently, according to Lloyd's Hobbes, this follows from the nature of what it is for some consideration to be a reason. For, being a reason to φ cannot be indexed to a particular person; reasons by their very nature apply to all who are in a certain situation. There can be no rational haecceities, as it were. Thus, if A expects others to accept R as justifying his φ-ing, then A must accept R as justifying others' φ-ing.

Lloyd deploys one of Hobbes's examples to effectively illuminate this point. Suppose A intends to invade B's country, for the sake of R, namely to spread the one true religion. Is R a reason for A to invade B? This depends upon whether A would accept from B an appeal to R as a justification for invading A's country. Of course, if R is pitched in terms of spreading the one true religion where the referent of "one true religion" is fixed by A's beliefs, then A might accept the reason. But, consistency requires A treating the referent of "one true religion" as something B would accept (since B would deny that the religion A is spreading is the one true religion). So, whether R is a reason for A to invade B's country depends upon whether A would accept that B is blameless for invading A's country in order to spread what B believes is the one true religion. Since A's invasion of B's country is premised upon B's religion not being the one true religion, A could not accept that B is blameless for invading A's own country to spread what B believes is the one true religion. So, all else being equal, A does not have a reason to invade B's country.

All this is starting to sound suspiciously Kantian -- or even Scanlonian. But not to worry. For, whether someone has a reason to φ depends partially on her occurrent attitudes: what she wants to do and what she would offer as a justifying reason to others. RT is therefore a perspectival theory of practical reason. The tempering provided by the consistency requirement generates only a modest objectivity. Consequently, if B would never, ever offer R as a justification for his φ-ing, but A would do so, then R is a reason to φ only for A, and not for B.[1]

Much more must be said -- and Lloyd offers a very nice discussion at pp. 222-230 -- about how to formulate the act-consideration pair that is then to be 'tested' by the RT. Space restrictions prevent me from exploring Lloyd's discussion of this issue. A brief comment is worth making though.

As Lloyd rightly highlights, the problem of the formulation of the act-consideration pair is somewhat symmetrical to the problem of the formulation of the Kantian maxim that is tested by the Categorical Imperative. The problem distinctive to Hobbes, though, is that there is no universally correct unique formulation of the act-consideration pair (as there is in, e.g., the famous cases in Kant's Groundwork). The formulation depends upon the actual attitudes of the acting agent and, in a very interesting way, the actual attitudes of those with whom that agent interacts in virtue of the action in question. The RT can also apply recursively if we treat as an action the very application of an action-description when assessing whether one is justified in action. Thus Lloyd writes:

we must each step back a pace from the primary dispute and ask whether each is content to allow the other to deliberate on the basis of that other's preferred action-description. If so, and they are content to disagree, the reciprocity theorem allows that each acts in accordance with reason in [e.g.,] seeking to impose his or her own (as they see it, true) religion while condemning the other's attempt to impose their different religion. If not, and each would fault the other for arrogantly insisting upon his or her own action-description in this important and contested case, then the reciprocity theorem … will not permit those who fault others for insisting on a contested action-description to insist on their own contested action-description. (p. 225)[2]

Gathering these reflections together, let us render the RT as follows:

(RT) Assuming A intends to φ for the sake of R: R is a reason for A to φ iff a perfectly consistent A would not blame anyone for φ-ing for R.

The RT is a constructivist account of practical reason since it explains what counts as a reason in terms of a suitably constructed subject's responses to actions on the basis of certain considerations. If the constructed subject is not disposed to blame someone performing that action for the sake of that consideration, then insofar as someone takes that consideration to apply to her, then she has a reason to act. This is not the twentieth-century's constructivism, which aims at a somewhat more robust universality than the RT's constructivism. But, it is constructivism nonetheless.

The RT also amounts to what many today call constitutivism.[3] Constitutivism is the view that the objective authority of moral norms (and perhaps even value) can be grounded in norms or aims that are supposedly constitutive of human practical agency. The RT is constitutivist because it is, itself, grounded in the nature of human rationality. The argument, given at pp. 219-220 and partially summarized above, runs as follows:

1. Humans are rational beings.

2. But what makes a being rational is that it acts for reasons.

3. In particular, what it is to act as opposed merely to behave in a manner driven by one's desires and fears is to guide one's behavior by way of appeal to reasons one takes oneself to have.

4. But, behaving in light of the reasons one takes oneself to have just is to act in a way that meets the standard expressed by the RT.

5. So, if humans are to act at all, they must act in accordance with the RT.

6. Humans are inescapably driven to act.

7. So, humans are inescapably governed by the RT: "any agent whose actions are to accord with reason must regulate his own actions by the standards of judgment he applies to the actions of others." (p. 248)

The constitutive feature of Lloyd's account of Hobbes's meta-normative theory receives short shrift in the text. But since she argues that the authority of the Laws of Nature is grounded in the authority of the RT, the question of what grounds the authority of the RT immediately arises. Lloyd never asks this question, but it's because she seems to think that once it is demonstrated that the RT follows from what it is to be a rational being, the authority of the RT will be self-evident. Thus she writes: "The reasonable is built into our conception of man as a rational animal from the very beginning." (p. 233) But, if by "the reasonable" she means only "the content of the laws of nature" then she leaves Hobbes open to the obvious challenge: "But why obey the laws of nature?" Lloyd simply does not see this question as on the table. But of course it is! And, if Lloyd fails to answer it, then the meta-normative theory she imputes to Hobbes remains incomplete and unsatisfying. Fortunately, what Lloyd says Hobbes is up to amounts to an attempt to answer the question, even though Lloyd doesn't recognize the significance of what she herself is up to.

In sum, we have a constructivist account of how practical reasons get their contents and a constitutivist account of how practical reasons get their authority and all this pivots around the RT.[4] As I've already stated, this is, in light of the commonly accepted understanding of Hobbes, a very startling interpretation.

Let us now briefly consider Lloyd's interpretation of how the contents of the Laws of Nature (LoN) follow from the RT (this discussion is at pp. 234-247). The argument Lloyd sees in Hobbes, which can be found at pp. 241-242, runs roughly as follows.

A central concept for Hobbes is power, which is the ability to satisfy one's desires. The one necessary desire that all agents have, regardless of the content of any of their other desires, is the desire for power. A necessary condition for power is peace. Therefore, on pain of inconsistency, each person must treat the desire for power as justification for seeking peace. So each person must accept that every other person may blamelessly seek peace out of the desire for power. That is, everyone has a practical reason to seek peace.

But, this argument fails to establish an obligation. For, there is a difference between demonstrating that everyone has a reason to do something and demonstrating that there is a rational requirement that all people do something. And the Law of Nature is a rational requirement; it is not merely a reason that all persons have. For, the LoN says that not seeking peace (and if peace isn't available then not defending oneself) is irrational. So, to show that the RT grounds the LoN, Lloyd must show how the RT rules out ever having a reason not to seek peace.

Notice, by the way, that the character who Lloyd must demonstrate hasn't reasons not to seek peace isn't the glory-seeker. The glory-seeker, who claims that the desire for glory is a reason not to seek peace, could not accept from others that they have this reason not to seek peace. For, the glory-seeker requires others to stand in awe of him and to obey him. But, if these others have reasons to war with him, then he doesn't have their awe. So, the glory-seeker would be guilty of inconsistency if he insists that he has a reason not to seek peace.

The character who poses a problem for Lloyd's derivation of the first LoN is the lover of chaos (this is my own invention -- neither Hobbes nor Lloyd ever mentions this character). This person would offer her love of chaos as a justification for not seeking peace. She would also happily accept from anyone else a similar love as a legitimate justification for not seeking peace. For, others not seeking peace would generate more beloved chaos. So, while the chaos lover may have a reason to seek peace, she also can consistently recognize a reason not to seek peace. That is, she is not obligated to seek peace.

Lloyd must argue that the love of chaos could never be a reason for action for anyone. This is tricky but I think Lloyd finds the resources in Hobbes for such an argument. The argument would look something like the following. Being an agent essentially involves the desire not to have one's power totally destroyed. Since action can only be the product of agency, action presumes the desire not to have one's power totally destroyed. So, desiring not to have power is tantamount to desiring not to act. So, insofar as one acts, one desires not to have one's power totally destroyed. So, no one could ever sincerely and without contradiction offer the desire not to have any power as a justification for any action. Chaos is the same as war and war is the absence of power. So, one can never argue that her love of chaos (i.e., the desire for no power) is a reason for any action, even if that action is seeking war. I do not endorse this argument, but I think Lloyd's interpretation of Hobbes allows Hobbes to make it in response to the chaos-lover. I think that Lloyd's account of Hobbes's derivation of the LoN from the RT would be stronger had she considered something like this argument.

The very narrow focus of this book review -- I discuss almost exclusively the approximately fifty pages of Chapter Five -- is not meant to suggest that there are not other fascinating and well-argued features of this book. Lloyd's discussion of the self-effacing character of natural law is innovative and the best analysis I've seen of Hobbes's account of the relationship between natural law and positive law. Her re-reading of Hobbes's response to the Foole is also groundbreaking. In addition to these very substantial discussions late in the book, there are numerous other significant observations that not only profoundly illuminate Hobbes's overall normative project but that will also significantly change the landscape of Hobbes scholarship in analytic philosophy. For example, Lloyd rightly highlights that Hobbes believed that the desire to justify oneself plays a central, driving role in human psychology. Lloyd then argues that the desire for self-preservation should not be treated as the sovereign desire in terms of which all other desires must be understood.

Morality in the Philosophy of Thomas Hobbes and Lloyd's first book, Ideals as Interests in Hobbes's Leviathan, are, I think, among the most exciting, most important, and most philosophically sophisticated unified readings of Thomas Hobbes's moral and political theory. I recommend these two books to all who are interested in contemporary Hobbes scholarship.[5]

[1] Could it also be that R could be for one person a reason to j, while for another R is a reason not to j? Much depends upon it being intelligible for R to count both for and against the same action, but not at the same time for the same person.

[2] Lloyd also writes:

Although there may be no unique action-description that is both sufficiently abstract and uncontested by all parties, pressure to abstract for the sake of agreement will be counterbalanced by pressure toward specificity to preserve the salient features of the action to be judged. The Archimedean point these countervailing pressures fix is the least abstract, noncontested description available, or any of these, should there turn out to be more than one. (p. 229)

[3] Among the most well-known defenses of constitutivism are Christine Korsgaard (1996), The Sources of Normativity (New York: Cambridge University Press), Christine Korsgaard (2009) Self-Constitution, Agency and Integrity (New York: Oxford University Press), David Velleman (2000) The Possibility of Practical Reason (New York: Oxford University Press), and David Velleman (2009), How We Get Along (New York: Cambridge University Press).

[4] Much more needs to be said and objections answered. For the most significant problem faced by the constitutivist, see David Enoch (2006), "Agency, Shmagency" Philosophical Review 115 (2): 169-198.

[5] I thank Susanne Sreedhar for helpful discussion of this material.