Morality's Progress

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Jamieson, Dale, Morality's Progress, Oxford University Press, 2002, 380pp, 24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199251452.

Reviewed by Kristin Shrader-Frechette , University of Notre Dame


In the title essay, Jamieson argues that moral progress is possible and that we have experienced it in our lifetimes. The remainder of the volume includes 21 previously published essays, all of which address specific issues on which moral progress is needed. Most of the chapters focus on treatment of animals, but several deal with other environmental issues such as sustainable development. From a substantive point of view, the book is important because it is full of compassion and ethical insight. From a methodological point of view, the book is interesting both because of its readability and because it offers a window on how a “philosophically naturalist, morally consequentialist, and metaethically constructivist” (vii) person might do practical ethics.

In the first essay, Jamieson defines and defends moral progress as “the increasing dominance of objective, impersonal, or agent-neutral reasons for action over subjective, personal, or agent-relative reasons” (9). He says progress involves “the abolition of war and slavery, the reduction of poverty and class privilege, the extension of liberty, the empowerment of marginalized groups, and respect for animals and nature” (9). Lauding the classical utilitarians as moral progressives (12), Jamieson nevertheless argues that a wide variety of ethical theorists could endorse his account of moral progress (13). He closes the chapter with two important contemporary examples of moral progress: the end of “American apartheid,” with the l964 Civil Rights Act, and the growing recognition of animal rights. To achieve such moral progress, Jamieson argues in chapter 2 that philosophers must forego the prejudice of sharply distinguishing moral theory from moral practice and the belief that the former has little or nothing to do with acting morally. His solution is to defend “applied philosophy” and argue for doing it.

Most of the essays in the remainder of the book deal with animal rights. Chapter 3 argues for endorsing the “Declaration on the Great Apes,” that is, the rights of chimpanzees, gorillas, and orangutans who are members of our “community of equals within which certain basic moral principles govern our relationships with each other”; among these principles, Jamieson includes “the right to life and the protection of individual liberty” (48). Chapter 4 defends attributing mental states to animals, while chapters 5 and 6 clarify and defend cognitive ethology, the study of the biological bases of behavior. All three chapters explain behavior within evolutionary history, emphasize the similarities between humans and other animals, and lay a foundation for chapter 7. There Jamieson argues that much human behavior is at odds with acceptance of the truism that one ought to minimize pain; most humans do not minimize animal pain. Next he argues that harming an animal for any reason, including scientific research, requires a defense (chapters 8-9). Animals, he says, are like humans in relevant ways; they are innocent; and our bad treatment of them makes us worse as people.

Chapter 10 examines the relation between cognition and moral status, including issues such as privacy. Chapters 11 and 12 argue against zoos, while chapters 13 and 14, respectively, argue against not only the distinction between wild and captive animals but also the separation of environmental ethics from animal liberation. Chapter 16 argues for a pluralistic metaethics, which Jamieson calls “sensible objectivism” (234) and which combines elements of subjectivism, conventionalism, and realism. Nevertheless, he maintains that all these metaethical positions, taken singly, also are compatible with the view that there are values in nature.

Most of the remainder of the volume argues against a variety of current environmental policies, including using “ecosystem health” as a scientific term (chapter 15); most attempts at central planning/redevelopment (chapter 17); US policy on global warming (chapter 18); too limited a conception of environmental justice (chapter 19); naive implementation of biotechnology (chapter 20); and sustainability that ignores ethics (chapter 21). The final chapter is an entertaining and sensitive autobiography that traces Jamieson’s evolution from a child of the sixties to a philosopher interested in language, science, and the elimination of animal suffering.

As a collection of partially-unrelated essays, the volume has six important strengths to recommend it. First, the issues with which Jamieson deals are fundamentally important: whether moral progress is possible; whether society has been massively unethical in its treatment of animals; whether current patterns of resource distribution are equitable and how most lifestyles contribute to inequity. Second, his argument – that different ethical perspectives (virtue theory, deontology, and utilitarianism) can be shown to support respect for animals and for nature – seems effective, correct, and importantly different from related claims made by Amartya Sen and Richard Brandt. Third, his chapter-two defense of applied ethics is the best anywhere. Every philosopher should read it. My only quibble is that instead of “applied ethics,” he should have said “practical ethics.” As Feinberg realized, practical ethics is not the mindless, “plug-and-chug” application of fully-formed ethical theories to contemporary problems, but the amendment and enrichment of ethical theory itself, on the basis of factual, practical, and case-specific information, and vice-versa. “Practical ethics” does more justice both to the complexity of work like Jamieson’s, and to affirming the continuity between contemporary practical ethics and classical normative ethics -- in the tradition of Plato, Aristotle, Kant, and Mill.

Another virtue of the volume is its profound and thought-provoking insights (especially in the area of ethics and animal suffering). These insights reveal good philosophical instincts, such as realizing that the side bearing the burden of proof often will come out second-best in a philosophical controversy. Jamieson deftly changes the burden of proof when he claims “When I look at an animal as a behaving body….the real object of my perception has been displaced by a philosophical monster – the idea of a behaving body….[that] needlessly problematizes the question of animal minds…. When scientists assume that what we observe is bodily movements and then worry about whether any inference to internal mental states is justified, they wrap themselves in the garb of hard-headed empiricism. But really they are recommending a disorder as a methodological stance” (57, 69; see also 135). His insights also frequently have a knack for exposing inconsistency, as when he notes: “Is it really better to confine a few hapless Mountain Gorillas in a zoo than to permit the species to become extinct? To most environmentalists the answer is obvious: the species must be preserved at all costs. But this smacks of sacrificing the lower-case gorilla for the upper case Gorilla….What is to blame is the peculiar moral schizophrenia of a culture that drives a species to the edge of extinction and then romanticizes its remnants” (173, 178; see also 186, 188, 253, 257, 301, 311, 314, 317, 320, 334-336).

Because Jamieson’s book relies on his rich understanding of a wealth of literature, he is able to bring new arguments for animal liberation out of old texts that others may have misread or left unread. For example, he cites the case of Kant, who condemns the man who shoots a dog who has become too old to serve (169); and of C. S. Lewis, who argued that, if animals have no souls and no life beyond the grave, then the obligation to minimize their suffering is increased by the fact that there is nothing, beyond the grave, to counterbalance their pain (110).

Still another strength is Jamieson’s witty, common-sensical, and accessible prose. After his elegant argument for animal minds, based on cognitive ethology, it is a delight to read about his dog : “I can identify Toby’s mental states more reliably than those of the President of my college” (63). Seventh, because of his blend of philosophical argument, insight, and good prose, Jamieson’s volume is one to be enjoyed by students, philosophy professors, animal-rights activists, and thoughtful policymakers. Jane Goodall said the volume was full of “clarity, elegance, and courage,” and she is right. The same could not be said of most volumes of contemporary moral philosophy.

With so much to praise in Jamieson, does the volume generate any worries? Such worries might fall into any of three areas: metaethics, environmental ethics, and animal liberation. On the metaethics front, one concern is whether Jamieson is correct that metaethics has no normative entailments (231, 233-234). If not, then one wonders why Jamieson in chapter 2 criticizes the claim that moral theory has no bearing on moral practice and seeks to remedy the disconnect. If not, one also wonders why Jamieson, later in the book, takes pains to argue that various metaethical positions (subjectivism, conventionalism, and realism) are compatible with affirming value in nature. A second metaethical concern, one of professional philosophers, might be whether Jamieson ought to have spent so much time preaching to the converted, regarding relatively easy first-order ethical claims, while doing little second-order ethical analysis. For example, he spends a chapter arguing that people do not consistently attempt to minimize suffering, including that of animals, while they claim to want to do so (97; see pp. 135, 152, 210; see also pp. 107, 111, 117-119, 123, 129, 145, 162, 172, 184). Obviously he is correct here. But isn’t the real issue that of dissecting, via second-order ethical analyses, why and when one might be justified in minimizing or not minimizing such suffering? In what cases might eating meat be justified, if ever? A related worry is whether Jamieson can consistently (and often without argument) defer to populist wisdom, in repeated cases, but reject it in other cases, also often without argument. For example, he defers to populist wisdom in accepting the claim that there are animal minds, but he rejects the populist belief in the reality of moral values (233; see 241, 277). The problem is not his populist predispositions (which I share). Rather, to the degree that one claims to follow these predispositions, often without argument, then one seems bound to explain and defend one’s deviations from them.

Regarding environmental ethics, some minor concerns are whether Jamieson sometimes gets his science slightly wrong. For instance, he questions much economic theorizing on grounds of willingness to pay, but he ignores willingness to accept; he questions ecological science as a basis for environmental ethics and policy (216), yet he ignores more sophisticated ecological methods and models. The volume also could have been improved had he updated the science in his essays. Several of them do not reflect the scientific about-face that has taken place, on topics like global warming, in the last 15 years. And sometimes Jamieson merely appeals to some scientific authority (131), when what he seems to need to do is adjudicate conflicting claims of different scientists.

With respect to animal liberation, philosophers might ask whether Jamieson ought to assume, with only limited argument, that apes and humans have equal rights (233). Should he merely have preached to the converted, that gorillas, apes, orangutans, and humans have equal rights to life (ch. 3), but failed to provide the complicated analysis of concepts like “equality,” necessary to sustain such a position? Or should he have claimed that animals and humans share community (ch. 8, esp. 107, 128), but failed to give any arguments about the conditions that are necessary and sufficient for moral community? After all, one does not need to have moral community with animals in order to argue effectively that it is wrong to harm them. Yet in his concern with evolutionary history and animal minds, Jamieson has the basis for arguing effectively about his community claims. But what are the precise necessary and sufficient conditions for moral community? Does he agree with the classic stance of Golding, that members of a moral community must share a conception of the good?

Another worry is whether Jamieson can completely escape Tom Regan’s charge (made against many animal liberationists and environmentalists) that they are misanthropic “environmental fascists.” Without argument, Jamieson says that the destruction of the old city of Dubrovnik “would be a greater crime than some measure of death and destruction wrought upon the people of Dubrovnik” (206). Such remarks may leave him open to Regan-type charges. Finally, one wonders whether Jamieson can convincingly argue, to the nonconverted, that all sentient beings ought to be in the sphere of moral concern (7), but fail to provide second-order ethical criteria for adjudicating claims made by, or on behalf of, different sentient beings (see pp. 48, 50). His basic point about sentient beings and moral concern seems correct, but the difficult philosophical business is not that point but instead developing criteria for resolving conflicts among sentients.

From the point of view of philosophical flaws, the previous discussion suggests no great concerns. This is in part because many of the questions (raised above) have been addressed in Jamieson’s journal articles. Also, virtually all these philosophical worries are more correctly understood as merely audience-specific questions from professional moral philosophers, worried about second-order ethical analyses. As such, these worries merely are requests for Jamieson to tell a fuller, more philosophically and scientifically sophisticated, story. Yet a more philosophically and scientifically sophisticated story arguably would bleed the manuscript of its readability, clarity, wit, and courage. The resulting book likely would not be one that nonprofessionals, as well as philosophers, would read. In short, Jamieson ought to be defended for failing to address more journal-appropriate metaethical disputes, in large part because of his audience. But given this more inclusive audience, his book would have been better, had he updated the science in old essays (like ch. 18) and had he edited his volume, so as to reconcile apparent inconsistencies in positions he took at different stages of his career. The book also would have been better had he removed offhand appeals to alternative metaethical positions, especially since he repeatedly claims that such positions carry no normative entailments in the real world (231-234), and had he removed chapters (like 14) that detail largely abstract, internecine battles among theoretical environmental philosophers. But these quibbles are minor. They speak largely to the difficulty of writing both for laypeople, in hopes of changing the world, and for philosophers, in hopes of changing the way we see the world. Jamieson is one of the best at doing both.