Morality Without God

Placeholder book cover

Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, Morality Without God, Oxford UP, 2009, 172pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195337631.

Reviewed by Mark C. Murphy, Georgetown University



Walter Sinnott-Armstrong’s book is titled Morality Without God, one of those unpronounceable names, like Prince’s symbol circa 1993. Would that it were simply unpronounceable and not deeply ambiguous. Does it mean that the idea of morality without God is foolishness, so let’s strike out that “Without God”, leaving us with the genuine article, Morality? No, that’s not what it means. Sinnott-Armstrong tells us that the point of the title is that “the goal of this book is to show that there really is no question about morality without God. There is just plain morality” (p. xi). Which seems a strain.

The series that Sinnott-Armstrong edits and in which this book appears is called “Philosophy in Action” — “Small Books About Big Ideas” — and its aim is to address fundamental matters of human concern in an accessible but philosophically rigorous way. The big idea with which this small book deals is the relationship between morality and religion, and in particular the claim that morality has an essential dependence on religion. Sinnott-Armstrong settles on “modern evangelical Christianity” as the target religion (p. xv). I’m not sure by what criterion modern evangelical Christianity is distinguished from ordinary orthodox Christianity. This turns out to have some importance, because Sinnott-Armstrong feels free to include as part of his case against morality’s dependence on God a variety of contentious readings of biblical texts, readings that one can reject without calling into question one’s condition as an orthodox Christian.

Sinnott-Armstrong, in summarizing his position, puts his thesis forward boldly: there is no interesting positive relationship between God and morality (pp. xi-xii). After an opening chapter on the state of mutual distrust between theists and atheists, the remaining chapters consist of explorations of possible connections between God and morality. The second and third chapters are concerned with the relationship between morally admirable behavior and belief in God, whether at the individual (Chapter 2) or societal (Chapter 3) level. The fourth chapter lays out a nontheistic ethics, and the fifth criticizes theistic ethics as at best unhelpful and at worst absurd and morally repugnant. Chapter 6 discusses reasons to adhere to moral norms, arguing for the adequacy of nontheistic accounts of these issues, and the seventh tries to show that moral epistemology poses no greater mysteries for the nontheist than for the theist. The concluding chapter suggests directions for further dialogue between theists and atheists.

It is sometimes claimed that belief in God is necessary for, or a tremendous help to, proper moral behavior. (Here is, for example, John Locke: “”color:black;“>Promises, covenants, and oaths, which are the bonds of human society, can have no hold upon an atheist. The taking away of God, though but even in thought, dissolves all” [“Letter Concerning Toleration”, in John Horton and Susan Mendus, eds., John Locke’s Letter On Toleration In Focus, Routledge, 1991, p. 33].) Sinnott-Armstrong presents arguments that this view is either mistaken or radically underjustified, whether it is taken either as a judgment about an individual’s motivation to act morally or what one might call societal tendencies to act well or badly. The more persuasive of Sinnott-Armstrong’s arguments here are empirical: if one expects that religious belief will be empirically correlated with morally good behavior, then what social science has revealed will be a disappointment, for the evidence is very mixed; in some cases religious belief seems to make no difference, and it may well be that there are certain sorts of misbehavior toward which nontheists have a stronger tendency and certain sorts toward which theists have a stronger tendency.

Sinnott-Armstrong also has arguments against the God-moral behavior connection that are not empirical. One might think that he would want to concede that if there is a God, then atheists will fail to act well morally with respect to those obligations that are owed to God or those that require action that presupposes belief in God. (He could just say that this is not a neutral basis for criticizing atheistic accounts of morality.) But Sinnott-Armstrong wants to go further than that; he wants to say that even if there are obligations to God, only theists can be subject to them. Why?

Consider, for example, the claim that everyone owes gratitude to God for creating and conserving him or her in existence. Sinnott-Armstrong’s denial that atheists are under any such obligations turns on the claim that a lack of knowledge of the conditions of benefaction precludes the existence of the relevant obligation:

Suppose you are caught in a bad snowstorm on the top of a mountain. You survive only because you find a cave to stay warm in. Suppose that a benefactor dug that cave in the mountainside just so that you could stay in it if you ever got caught in a storm up there. If you know about this benefactor, then surely you owe great gratitude. However, if you do not believe (and have no reason to believe) that any benefactor carved out the cave for your benefit, there is nothing morally wrong with … refusing to express gratitude. That is parallel to the position of the atheist. Thus, if God does exist, then believers owe Him gratitude, but it is not immoral for atheists to refuse to worship, thank, or even recognize God (p. 17).

What is the argument here — that if you innocently believe that the conditions that trigger a moral principle do not apply, then you do not act wrongly when failing to perform the action that the principle requires? That seems a mistake; we deal with such cases not by denying the wrongness of the act but by denying the culpability of the ignorant actor — if the ignorance itself really was inculpable. Think again about Sinnott-Armstrong’s own case. Suppose that you come to suspect that the cave was dug for your benefit by an unknown benefactor, and decide to investigate further. Can’t this be aptly described as trying to find out whether and to whom you owe gratitude? On Sinnott-Armstrong’s view, you can’t sensibly be trying to find this out, because you come to owe gratitude only upon discovering that there is such a benefactor.

Putting to the side the cases in which right action takes God as an intentional object, the view that religious belief is crucial for moral behavior may well be an optional one for an orthodox Christian to hold. By contrast, the view that moral norms are somehow grounded in theistic facts is very plausibly part-and-parcel of orthodox Christian theism, if for no other reason than that it is plausibly part-and-parcel of orthodox Christian theism that every fact is somehow grounded in theistic facts. So Sinnott-Armstrong’s aim is to sketch an account of moral norms that is entirely nontheistic, not dependent on theism for its correctness or warrant, and to show that the rival theistic view is inferior to it.

The nontheistic account (Chapter 4), which he calls “the” secularist’s view (p. 54) but which is obviously just one secularist view among others, bottoms out in the notion of prudential value: the fundamental ideas are (1) that we should not cause harm to anyone without adequate reason (p. 57); and (2) what is adequate reason to harm is specified in an impartial way (pp. 62-65). Sinnott-Armstrong takes it that everyone will allow that it is wrong for him or her to be harmed without adequate reason. (We should note, though, that the fact that everyone will allow this does not explain anything, and here it is the explanation of this requirement, not its existence, that is at issue.) Given the inability to mark out what, from a moral point of view, makes someone special, the prohibition on insufficiently justified harm inflicted by anyone on anyone else should hold generally. I do not want to make too much of a fuss about this picture, except to note that he needs to do a little more to show that this really is a view that does not require theism for its ultimate intelligibility. For example, Sinnott-Armstrong isn’t very clear on what he has in mind by harm (pain, disability, death, discomfort, subordination, humiliation, violation of “dignity” or “rights,” and the risk of any of the above are all classified as harms). Given that Sinnott-Armstrong rejects mere hedonistic or desire-fulfillment views of harm, it remains open for the theistic critic to argue that objectivist accounts of well-being make no sense without something like an account of welfare as proper functioning, which may very well be unavailable absent some theistic account (see, for example, Alvin Plantinga, Warrant and Proper Function, Oxford UP, 1993, pp. 199-215). Again, for example: given that Sinnott-Armstrong is a bit vague about who it is that merits moral concern and why (p. 74), it remains open for the theistic critic to argue that getting the right answer about who are appropriate objects of moral concern will require an appeal to God’s love for all beings made in God’s image (see, for example, Nicholas Wolterstorff, Justice: Rights and Wrongs, Princeton UP, 2008).

Sinnott-Armstrong turns his attention then to a theistic ethics alternative, asking whether theistic ethics can succeed better in capturing the basis of moral requirements. The first thing to note here is that Sinnott-Armstrong’s focus is entirely on divine command theory. There is slim justification for this. He had already put a natural law approach to the side, taking it to be more in line with his own secular view (p. xiv). But there are other clearly theocentric views out there, for example, those of the ‘What Would Jesus Do?’ variety, some of the central motivations of which have been captured theoretically in Linda Zagzebski’s work (Divine Motivation Theory, Cambridge UP, 2004). The precise sort of divine command theory to be considered Sinnott-Armstrong does not bother thinking through; he immediately settles on the sort of divine command theory defended by Robert Adams (Finite and Infinite Goods, Oxford UP, 1999), in which moral requirements just are divine commands.

Clearly Adams’s divine command theory must be Sinnott-Armstrong’s stalking horse here; it is the state-of-the-art divine command theory, and the basic description that Sinnott-Armstrong gives of the view that he is criticizing fits Adams’s picture. So one would think that Sinnott-Armstrong would want to be pretty careful about the basic distinctions that Adams offers and the central arguments that he makes in defending that standpoint. Here I have in mind at least the following: (1) Adams’s insistence that goodness, as contrasted with rightness, should be characterized in a way that is theistic but nonvoluntaristic — one in which God is the Good, and goodness is Godlikeness; (2) Adams’s recognition that God’s being essentially good is necessary for the plausibility of divine command theory; and (3) his appeal — along the same lines that, say, Stephen Darwall has followed (Second-Person Standpoint, Harvard UP, 2006, pp. 13-14) — to obligation as essentially social in arguing for divine command theory as a theory of what moral rightness is. These matters, however, are ignored or lightly passed over in Sinnott-Armstrong’s treatment, much to its detriment.

Here is one example. In thinking through the divine command view, Sinnott-Armstrong repeats the standard charge that actions have no moral status whatever until so conferred by a divine command. Of course, this is not entailed by the view that Sinnott-Armstrong is criticizing; all that is entailed by that view is that no action is morally required or forbidden unless the object of a divine command. It is consistent with Adams’s view — and Adams affirms it — that actions can be good or bad in various ways independently of being divinely commanded. For the most part, Sinnott-Armstrong ignores that point. He does, however, acknowledge its relevance briefly:

Wrongness is, admittedly, distinct from badness. Nonetheless, this response falls flat. [A] Because rape is so bad in a moral way, it would be bad for God to command us to rape. [B] It would also be bad for Him not to command us not to rape. © The badness of rape, thus, puts moral constraints on God’s commands. [D] But then it seems that we would not have any moral duty to obey such bad commands, even if God issued those bad commands. [E] It also seems that we would have a moral duty to do what He should have commanded even if He did not actually command it (p. 104).

Adams would, I think, be happy to affirm [A] and [B], and even © so long as we do not confusedly read “constraint” in any deontic sense. [D] is hard to evaluate, given the counterpossible character of God’s issuing bad commands; nevertheless the basic idea is accepted by Adams — part of what makes God a legitimate authority is that the commands God gives are good. But [E] manifestly does not follow from any of this. At any rate, Sinnott-Armstrong’s recognition of the relevance of the distinction between badness and wrongness is only at the surface; he immediately returns to producing arguments that require there to be no relevant distinction between them, as in the following bit:

If we knew that God is all-good, but we did not know that rape is bad, then we would not know whether or not God could command rape. In order to get from the premise that God is all-good to the conclusion that God could never command us to rape, we need to assume that rape is bad and wrong. That suppressed premise required an independent standard that makes rape bad and wrong. Divine command theorists cannot assume such a standard, because the whole point of divine command theory is to deny any such independent standard of moral wrongness. Hence, they cannot appeal to the wrongness of rape in order to show that God could never command rape (pp. 105-106).

The slide from badness to wrongness is obvious and vitiates the argument.

Here is another example of ignoring Adams’s central arguments for his position. Sinnott-Armstrong’s argument that moral wrongness makes perfect sense without any commanding authority proceeds by ignoring Adams’s arguments on the social character of obligation:

It is not clear why an authority is supposed to be necessary for moral wrongness. After all, there is something logically wrong about contradicting yourself. There is something epistemically wrong about believing in life on Mars for no reason at all. And there is something rationally wrong about causing oneself severe pain for no reason… . No specific person or God issues these laws of logic, epistemology, or rationality. Thus, there seem to be several kinds of wrongness that do not depend on any specific lawgiver (pp. 97-98).

But to concede that there is a way in which one can go wrong with respect to some domain is not to explain how moral wronging is possible. Adams’s central argument for his divine command account is that obligation has a social character, so that as a conceptual matter obligation is tied to demands made by one party on another and the violations of which constitute a rupture in the social bonds between the parties. If there is no God, Adams concedes, then we would have to identify moral obligation with something else — perhaps Sinnott-Armstrong’s secularist morality, perhaps Darwall’s implicit commands of some hazy moral community (Darwall, p. 292) — but nothing would satisfy the role set by the concept of moral obligation like that of the divinely commanded.

Sinnott-Armstrong also charges the divine command view with failing to respect the objectivity of morality. While conceding that on the divine command view morality is objective in the weak sense that an action’s being morally wrong does not depend on any human’s having some belief about that action’s moral status, it "is not objective in the stronger sense that whether an act is morally wrong does not depend on whether anyone thinks that it is morally wrong" (p. 76). Well, of course, if the divine command view is correct, then an action is morally wrong if and only if God believes that it is morally wrong, but only because, for any p, p if and only if God believes that p. If Sinnott-Armstrong’s claim is that the divine command view makes the moral wrongness of an action depend in some stronger sense on God’s believing that the action is morally wrong, that is just an error. What an action’s moral wrongness depends on, on this view, is whether God gave a command forbidding that action. Of course, for one to give a sincere command that another perform some action requires one to have certain beliefs (e.g. that the action is possibly performed), but it is no objection to the objectivity of morality on the divine command view that the obtaining of certain deontic states of affairs depends on some persons’ having some beliefs or other.

Chapter 6 is concerned with whether theistic ethics has an advantage over nontheistic ethics with respect to the question “Why be moral?” Sinnott-Armstrong interprets the “Why be moral?” question as a pretty modest query about whether, when it is morally required that one perform some action, there is a normative reason to perform that action. There being some reason to perform some action, on Sinnott-Armstrong’s gloss, means that it is not sheerly irrational, that is, “not crazy” to do it (p. 117). He argues that since what his secularist ethic rules out is the doing of harm, and one has reason not to cause harm to others just insofar as those are harms to others, the “Why be moral?” question is easily successfully answered by the nontheistic ethicist. That the same explanation he gives for why the would-be rapist has reason to act morally can be offered for why a would-be rapist has reason to commit the rape does not seem to strike Sinnott-Armstrong as problematic; of course it isn’t problematic given the weak understanding of the “Why be moral?” question and what would count as a successful solution to it. It would be helpful if Sinnott-Armstrong had named an opponent here who thought that this was the real challenge for the nontheistic ethicist. The worry is not characteristically expressed by theistic ethicists in terms of whether there is any reason to do what is morally right in the absence of God; the worry is characteristically expressed in terms of whether there could be overriding, or decisive, reason to do what is all-things-considered morally required. It is not as if theistic ethicists are the only ones who have felt this tension. Look at Sidgwick’s dualism of practical reason (Methods of Ethics, 7th ed., Hackett, 1981, pp. 507-509): the worry is that there are different kinds of reason that can pull in different directions, and it is not obvious that there is any practical error in choosing against a more impartial point of view by going with the more partial point of view. Again, as Sidgwick acknowledged, this tension could be met if there were a being who ensured that the practical viewpoints would not point in different directions (Sidgwick, pp. 506). All of this seems to count for Sinnott-Armstrong as a nonissue.

On the “Why be moral?” question, Sinnott-Armstrong criticizes the theistic view for making it all about the carrot and stick of heaven and hell (p. 119). This seems, to put it mildly, a caricature. There are lots of theistically-based reasons that could explain the general and very strong reason to do what is morally right: that if there is a God, then friendship with God would be the greatest possible human good, and friendship involves doing the will of the friend; or if there is a God, then that being bears practical authority, and that being’s say-so will provide a protected reason specifying how one is to act with respect to the various first-order goods and evils in light of which one needs to decide what to do. Even if we stick to the straight rewards-and-punishments answer, these need not be appealed to as the justification for taking morally right action as one’s goal; rather, these function as assurances that acting rightly will not be to one’s ultimate and irredeemable disadvantage. (One might note that the particular sorts of rewards and punishments to which Christians often make reference — heaven and hell — seem a bit overkill for that philosophical job, but of course the retort is that heaven and hell are not posited by Christians as the minimum necessary postmortem conditions to solve some philosophical problem about morality.) Sinnott-Armstrong also suggests that, in any event, any divine command view that appeals to God’s holding people responsible for acting wrongly in order to explain their reasons to act rightly must founder on the fact that God would not hold people responsible for meeting standards that they do not know about, and on the divine command view nonbelievers have no way of knowing what is right or wrong if they do not believe that there is a God to issue commands (p. 122). Again, the argument obviously fails. Do we suppose that Moses could not know that the water of the Red Sea was parting, because water is H2O, and Moses did not know that the H2O of the Red Sea was parting?

The seventh chapter concerns moral epistemology. Again, Sinnott-Armstrong begins by describing a standard fully secular account of how moral knowledge can be gained, one that emphasizes eliminating distorting influences, ensuring compatibility with nonmoral beliefs, checking one’s judgments against those of other serious inquirers, and so forth (pp. 130-134). Now, one might think: surely the theistic ethicist — at least the Christian theistic ethicist who is Sinnott-Armstrong’s principal target — can take account of all of those sources of moral justification, and more; he or she can also appeal to Scripture and tradition. So surely the religious ethicist and Sinnott-Armstrong should be able to agree that if these properly religious sources of moral judgment are reliable and have some independence from these other sources of moral judgment, then the religious ethicist has some advantage over the secular ethicist; these are additional sources of insight by which one’s moral judgment can be disciplined. The theistic ethicist and Sinnott-Armstrong can then amicably part ways over the reliability of these religious sources. Strangely, Sinnott-Armstrong does not seem to see it this way. He seems to think that theistic ethicists, in order to present a distinctive view, would have to exclude these other sources of moral insight, focusing on only the properly religious ones. (Thus he seems to think that the theistic ethicist should be troubled by the fact that reading religious texts, thinking through tradition, and so forth, is best done by engaging in the sort of distorting-influence-avoiding, communally-disciplined process aiming at reflective equilibrium that he advocates for the secular ethicist [p. 138].) Further, he seems to hold these religious sources to an incredibly high standard — unless they are perfectly accurate and complete with respect to what God commanded, one cannot place any reliance upon them (p. 136). Again, to see what some actual theistic ethicist has to say it is useful to turn to Adams’s discussion of doxastic practices in Finite and Infinite Goods (Adams, pp. 353-388).

The concluding chapter is a plea for theists and atheists to listen more carefully to one another, to understand better the merits of their theoretical standpoints and distinctive benefits of the forms of life that they inhabit. With this we should all agree, and hope that in dealing with our theistic or atheistic intellectual opponents we do a better job representing their views in their strongest possible formulations.