Morality, Self-Knowledge and Human Suffering: An Essay on the Loss of Confidence in the World

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Josep E. Corbí, Morality, Self-Knowledge and Human Suffering: An Essay on the Loss of Confidence in the World, Routledge, 2012, 254pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415890694.


Reviewed by Sarah Holtman, University of Minnesota, Twin Cities


Taking morality, most fundamentally, to offer guidance as we attempt to respond appropriately to human suffering, Josep Corbí criticizes "the Kantian approach" to moral questions and offers what he deems a more satisfactory alternative. Himself a moral particularist, Corbí focuses on the work of John Rawls and Christine Korsgaard as paradigmatic of the kind of Kantianism he rejects and appeals to detailed accounts of the effects of extermination camp survival, torture, and war to highlight claimed inadequacies.

Seven features characterize the Kantian approach as Corbí understands it: 1) the correctness of our moral judgments, on this view, depends on our ability to reach a certain kind of agreement; 2) the agreement in question is hypothetical rather than actual; 3) determining the terms of this agreement requires appeal to a procedure that is impartial among persons and among the world-views they actually endorse; 4) this procedure demands that agents engaged in it abstract from their own characters in various ways in order to avoid bias; 5) consequently, "the will", as opposed to the agent's desires, interests and needs, motivates proper moral deliberation; 6) the self thus is appropriately conceived to be divided between a passive side (composed of inclinations that cloud moral judgment in favor of self-interest) and an active side (able to reach decisions on morally appropriate grounds and to motivate action despite contrary passions); 7) the active side of the self is the ultimate source of value, and the moral principles that issue from it properly overrule decisions that have their source in the passive side (42-43).

Broadly conceived, Corbí's principal criticisms of Kantianism, so understood, resemble those advanced by a wide range of philosophers. These include not only other particularists, but also, e.g., Aristotelians, communitarians and virtue ethicists of various stripes (though of course there is overlap among these groups). Specifically, Corbí objects that, in its quest for impartiality, the Kantian approach excludes morally relevant considerations from moral decision-making and problematically divorces our purportedly true, rational selves from our self-interested and affective selves. The approach thus yields moral principles suited, at best, to an idealized world that is not ours and ultimately promotes the harmful behavior that it seeks to discourage (189-194).

Despite the similarities between Corbí's objections and those others often have raised, the concrete examples to which he appeals, and the use he attempts to make of them, render his versions of these criticisms distinctive. For instance, Primo Levi's shame at having survived Auschwitz, when others who were perhaps less selfish or more noble did not, prompts Corbí to suggest that we are ill-equipped to determine what counts as a rational response to horrific conditions that we have not experienced. If parties in the original position (or those taking up some similarly idealized perspective) lack the ability to appeal to such experiences, the moral principles they choose may be inadequate to address real world issues (21-34).

Yet more problematic, some varieties of harm occasion what Corbí calls a "loss of confidence in the world" (48-49). Such is the case, e.g., for the victims of torture and for soldiers who have experienced combat. Not only those who are harmed directly, but also third parties who come to appreciate both the harm itself and its causes, are at risk. Confronted with the inhumanity of the torturer or the brutality of war, these third parties may easily lose their ability to view the world as a place where human beings can trust one another to refrain from harming their fellows without warrant or, at the least, a place where each can count on others for aid if threatened with such harm. (45-52). The result is that third parties tend to turn away from these harms in an attempt to avoid the kind of knowledge that would occasion a devastating loss of confidence. Thus third parties readily accept, e.g., the torturer's claim that his victim is a danger and that torture is necessary to prevent great harm to others. In so doing, they become complicit in the terrible harm done to the victim. (188).

This fact about third party participation in harm should help us see, says Corbí, that the demands morality places on us may vary with the role we play. The would-be torturer must attend to considerations that found moral prohibitions on torture. The person who eschews the very possibility of participating directly in torture must recognize the too-human tendency to turn away, often through self-deception, from the wrongs being done to another.

But Kantianism, Corbí claims, cannot readily accommodate such varied moral demands. For its impartiality requirements exclude the context-dependent information on which appropriate distinctions depend and thus yield universal moral principles that are blind to relevant differences among perpetrators, third parties and victims themselves. Worse yet, the divided conception of the self that Kantianism endorses actually encourages us to ignore our feelings, experiences and inclinations as we contemplate what, morally speaking, we should and should not do. This inevitably deprives us of relevant information concerning both the consequences of our actions and what we might call our own inhumane tendencies (189-194).

Corbí's preferred approach to moral decision combines what he calls "receptive passivity", "permeability", and "expressive awareness". The first is an agent's developed ability to grasp an order that constrains her and to respond proportionately to the constraints she perceives (174-178). The second is the receptivity both of an agent's dispositions to her deliberation and of deliberation to dispositions (168-169). Finally, to be expressively aware of a situation (as opposed to merely declaratively aware) is to feel motivated to respond proportionately to it (51-52). The moral agent, on this view, is like a dancer who both perceives the order in a piece of music and is receptive to her dispositions in a way that allows her to respond to situations with expressive awareness (178-181). Rather than being bound by moral principles at best too rigid for our complex and imperfect world, she perceives what is morally required by complex situations and responds.

It is true that, as they stand, Rawls's arguments for justice as fairness, made from the perspective of ideal theory, speak only indirectly to the kinds of harm, and to the associated moral failings, that Corbí has in mind. Likewise, Korsgaard's Kantianism may well lack sufficiently thick moral foundations to allow us to provide the nuanced answers that vexed real-world moral questions demand. Moreover, of course, not only Rawls and Korsgaard, but Kantians more generally, understand morality to have its foundations not in our characters, but in action-guiding principles that both highlight those considerations that are of primary moral significance and describe the appropriate relationship among them. Yet none of this condemns Kantians to a morality that is wedded to a divided self, impervious to affect or experience, or incapable of offering context-sensitive answers to real-world moral questions.

Perhaps most familiarly, Rawls's original position is designed to allow us to develop principles of justice with an eye to considerations widely deemed to be of fundamental moral significance and to test those principles against our considered moral judgments regarding more concrete questions. Even if, as Corbí suggests, considered judgments may be developed without experience of the kind of devastating harms his examples highlight, facts about human psychology are among those that parties in the original position must consider. Moreover, idealizing assumptions (e.g., that the society for which principles are chosen is well ordered) are to be modified in later stages as principles of justice suited to real-world conditions are developed.[1] Thus there is not only room for but also a demand that we ultimately take into account both the effects of such harms and the tendency of third parties to "look away."

Importantly, Rawls's conception of the person, both in A Theory of Justice and in later works, is multi-faceted, and his aim is not to label some features as those of our true or active selves and others not. It is to acknowledge and honor persons as at once moral, possessed of passions, and endowed with the capacity and disposition to develop their own life plans. Not only, in Rawls's view, must an adequate theory of justice acknowledge each of these features. It must accord each an appropriate province and blend all three in determining what justice requires and in effectively working to achieve its aims.[2]

The principles of justice that Rawls famously endorses, then, are not the end of the story but very much the beginning. Much of the work that remains, on Rawls's own account, would involve a conversation about principles, affective capacities, and the complex features of an imperfect world. The aim of this conversation would be nuanced answers to difficult moral questions.

Although Rawls and Korsgaard are Corbí's main targets, he claims that Kantians more generally fall prey to his criticisms. Yet much recent (and not so recent) work by well known Kantians seeks to develop and extend Kant's own theory of virtue, argues that there is an important place in Kant and Kantianism for affectively informed moral decision, and develops context-sensitive Kantian responses to real-world moral questions.[3]

To attempt, of course, is not to succeed, and some attempts are bound to be more successful than others. But a reminder of the nature and scope of Rawls's project should be enough to suggest that the Kantian approach as Corbí describes it is a far cry from the Kantian approach as it is. Kant himself develops a practical philosophy that not only takes seriously the interplay among principle, character and affect but that acknowledges both the necessity of hope (or confidence in human progress and moral improvement) and the inevitable injustice of war.[4] Guided by this work, and in the spirit of it, contemporary Kantians have sought to describe their own dance among human features and capacities. This dance, like the one Corbí describes, takes place in an imperfect world and aims at greater justice. Though his examples and concerns are worthy of note, Corbí has neither acknowledged this central Kantian theme nor shown that the efforts of contemporary Kantians in this regard do (or must) fail.

[1] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice, Revised edition (Harvard University Press, 1999), Part One.

[2] See, e.g., Rawls, Theory, Part Three.

[3] See, e.g., Thomas E. Hill, Jr., Virtue, Rules and Justice Kantian Aspirations (Oxford University Press, 2012); Marcia Baron, Kantian Justice Almost Without Apology (Cornell University Press, 1995).

[4] See, e.g., Immanuel Kant, The Metaphysics of Morals, Mary Gregor, ed. and tr. in Practical Philosophy, The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant (Cambridge University Press, 1996); Kant, Toward Perpetual Peace, Gregor, ed. and tr. (Cambridge University Press, 1996).