Morals and Consent: Contractarian Solutions to Ethical Woes

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Malcolm Murray, Morals and Consent: Contractarian Solutions to Ethical Woes, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2017, 398 pp., $34.95, ISBN 9780773551114.

Reviewed by Jeremy Neill, Houston Baptist University


This book is an application of contractarianism to practical ethics. At nearly 400 pages, inclusive of footnotes, it is an ambitious tome. Its sheer investigative scope is striking and, I think, commendable. Its initial sections, which are focused on contractarianism's fundamentals, attempt to derive morality from non-moral, evolutionary sources. The book's investigations of contemporary ethical controversies are wide-ranging, and, as such, it will likely find its most fruitful pedagogical uses in graduate-level ethics survey seminars. Malcolm Murray's argumentation, especially in his discussions of the topics of beneficence and liberty, is rigorous and impressive. His inquiries into other, more traditional applied ethics topics are similarly perceptive. But the objections that Murray considers are not always his opponents' most powerful arguments, and the book more generally is colored by the rhetorical tone that has become typical in applied ethics in recent years.

The book is about 20% theory and 80% practice. In its theory sections, Murray traces morality to self-interest, and he argues that reciprocal cooperation is a medium between fighting (noncooperation) and acquiescing (nonreciprocation). The theory revolves around the consent principle, which holds that "any act is morally permissible if and only if all concerned parties (or their proxies) are competent and suitably informed, and voluntarily, or would voluntarily, consent" (5). There are minefields here, of course, in the keywords "voluntary," "competency," "proxies," "informed," "concerned party," and "consent." Murray does, commendably, offer fuller definitions.

For Murray, a post-Gauthier contractarian, morality is neither objective nor true. In fact, it is not actually a real thing. Rather, it is a fiction that has arisen over the millennia in order to facilitate our cooperative efforts, and, ultimately, to advance our personal interests. Murray's commitment to the morality-as-fiction view requires him to bite certain bullets. For instance, torturing small children is not a wrong as such. Instead, it is a wrong only insofar as it violates the norms which, within the contracting community, are deemed to be useful for the promotion of relative peace. Were those norms to change, or were the torturer to conclude (correctly) that she is capable of evading retaliation, her torture would cease to be objectionable. Murray describes his meta-ethical views as quasi-cognitivist, since he does not base his moral appraisals strictly upon emotions. Rather, he depicts such appraisals as having instrumental value for a statistically-likely reciprocal cooperation strategy. A good percentage of the book's theoretical sections are focused on objections to Murray's quasi-cognitivism. The Ring of Gyges problem, for instance, is referenced to handle the objection that contractarianism ceases to be prudential if and when the retaliation threat is suspended. Other contractarian objections that are considered include the agent who volunteers to be cannibalized (spoiler: if she's competent, we ought not to interfere), the problem of altruism, the possibility of unfairness, and communitarian worries about the metaphysical detachment of the contractarian self.

Murray traces the origins of our reciprocal cooperation (RC) to an evolutionary backstory. Basically, evolution selected us over eons for RC. As such, RC is now our optimal cooperative mechanism, qua self-interested agents. In my second reading of the book I realized I had some difficulties with Murray's treatment of objections against evolutionary morality accounts. For instance, his dismissal of the well-known 'unit of selection' objection is too quick. He asserts here merely that "it is more common that the benefits to the gene and the individual overlap," while never actually dealing with cases in which there are no commonalities among the adaptive benefits that arise for the gene and the individual. Murray, to be sure, is not writing a technical work. Nevertheless, the efforts that he makes here to defend his evolutionary origins story strike me as being a bit hasty, given the foundational role that that story plays in his later applied inquiries.

Perhaps surprisingly, given his belief that morality is a fiction, Murray thinks that morality has an evolutionary architecture and that the conventional norms of society ought not to trump that architecture. He also thinks that he is correctly identifying that architecture in both its theoretical and practical variants. But there are other people whose identification processes have gone awry. In fact, Murray thinks that it is possible for entire cultures to be mistaken in their belief that their norms constitute legitimate RC. I am not personally a contractarian, so I am not naturally sympathetic to this sort of a backstory about morality's evolutionary architecture. But even if I were, I think I would still see Murray's claims here as ad hoc. Why should Murray have so much confidence that his own interpretation of the RC evolutionary architecture is superior to the normative claims of someone from another culture, who, with a confidence level that is similar to Murray's, and an equally rigorous methodology, espouses differing ethical convictions? The problem here is that Murray appears to want to say, simultaneously, both that RC is a fiction that natural selection has developed over the millennia, and also that his own interpretations of its deliverances are superior to the interpretations of others. Later on, for example, Murphy suggests that his pro-euthanasia arguments are a correct application of the architecture of RC. But what are we to say about a non-western culture which, via duly-processed collective agreement, prohibits euthanasia in order to spare its disabled members from undesired psychological pressures or temptations? Are the members of such a culture irrational to take offense at Murray's interpretation of the evolutionary architecture? Or, to reference a different example, what about the many Muslims, Christians, or Buddhists in the world who would, say, after duly-processed internal negotiations, still be opposed to Murray's views about the acceptability of genetic modification? Again, are such persons just misinterpreting the evolutionary architecture? Perhaps they are, but what is pertinent here is that Murray's starting points are probably too modest for some of the conclusions that he reaches.

In its applied ethics sections the book is liberal. The scope and number of its applied investigations are ambitious. Murray argues in favor of abortion and euthanasia, and against capital punishment. He likewise develops contractarian arguments supporting homosexuality, pornography, and prostitution, and against rape, date rape, and quid pro quo threats and offers. He 'regretfully' finds difficulties with affirmative action, and he offers a qualified dismissal of classical beneficence -- which, roughly, is the idea that we have duties to relieve the suffering of others -- as a way of thinking that is supererogatory and, as such, non-obligatory. As for animals, contractarianism is human-centered. So it does not offer animals robust protections against instrumental uses. But it does, at least, protect them from wanton cruelty. Contractarianism suggests that we ought to try to preserve the environment, although it provides us with only qualified reasons to act for future generations. Genetic alterations such as reproductive cloning, therapeutic cloning, genetic treatment, and genetic enhancement are all justifiable so long as they are consistent with contractarianism's consent expectations and are allowing persons to pursue their understandings of the good in ways that are unconstrained. Organ selling is fine if the sellers are competent, informed, and acting voluntarily. Terrorism is unjustifiable, as it does not involve consent. Torturing terrorists is acceptable, assuming that the odds of information retrieval are substantial. Voluntary blackmail is likewise consistent with contractarianism, and demonstrating blackmail to be non-voluntary is a more difficult thing than it is often thought to be.

In all of his applied discussions, Murray makes a point of moving quickly, and of avoiding argumentative technicalities. I found this refreshing at times, and frustrating at others. The reading experience felt like I was encountering a series of in-depth cultural editorials -- like a rigorous version of the New York Review of Books. The book's origins are probably in Murray's lectures over the years in his applied ethics seminars. To be sure, several of the book's practical sections -- such as its treatment of our obligations to animals -- are sensitive investigations of difficult topics. But others read more like they are intended to be just quick summary statements. Murray most of the time seems to be writing with a sympathetic audience in mind -- say, professors who are already inclined toward his contractarian views and who might be considering the inclusion of this book in their seminar syllabi. So, when he tells us that we ought not to condemn the competent, self-destructive agent who chooses cannibalization, one wonders whether he would similarly defend views that are less fashionable than assisted suicide in western academic circles -- such as the Muslim woman who, competently, chooses a full-body burqa and defends the justice of her husband's physical abuse of her. The point, more generally, is just that the book does not set its argumentation within very many background assumptions explorations, and as such its conclusions are unlikely to be convincing to persons (from other cultures or outside of academic circles) who would approach such issues on the basis of different assumptions.

The strength of the book is its sheer scope. It demonstrates, reflectively and decisively, the relevance of contractarianism to a broad swath of applied fields. As such, it will likely find a niche as a quick, dynamic study that offers its readers a reliable overview of contractarianism's implications vis-à-vis contemporary ethics controversies. But potential readers should also be aware that cautionary statements and scholarly qualifications are not Murray's priority. Consider, for instance, his take on Hobbes. Murray sees Hobbes as a moral constructivist who thinks that amoral humans devised the fiction of morality in order to coordinate their lives together. To be sure, this is the sort of an understanding of Hobbes that has, among a certain circle of post-Gauthier contractarians, now become commonplace. Yet it is only a view whose contours are sustainable if one does not explore the many other, more nuanced encounters with the Hobbesian corpus that have arisen outside of that circle. It would have been nice if Murray had provided us with a little more scholarly precision here -- like an acknowledgment that there are other ways of reading Hobbes's natural law discussions that place a greater emphasis on Hobbes's moral objectivity claims. Or, perhaps Murray could have offered a disclaimer to inform us that his take on Hobbes is intended to be nothing more than a quasi-correct historical story to lend gravitas to his own account. The upshot is just that Murray's approach once more has the feeling of being hasty and, at times, a bit insular. This could, potentially, be a problem for those readers who are not already contractarian sympathizers.

One final comment that needs to be made is that in some of the book's practical sections Murray does not appear to let his contractarianism lead where it will. Instead, he arguably massages it in order to reach the conclusions that he already favors. Evidence for this is present in the rhetorical way in which the book's applied inquiries are developed. Evidence for it is also present in the way that Murray, not infrequently, turns to non-contractarian sociological resources and sometimes even to personal opinion to solve his practical problems. For instance, consider his discussion of pornography, and especially his investigation of the questions of whether pornography is a form of libel and/or is degrading to public perceptions of women. Feminist critics have long argued that pornography tells lies about women (i.e. bodies not brains, wanting to be violated, desiring aggression or violence, etc.), and that it damages them as a class by portraying them as mere objects to be used. Murray's reply is that most pornography does not in fact tell lies about women since most pornographers, purveyors of fictions, have no illusions about actually fooling their audience. Nor is pornography degrading, because its (primarily male) consumers are not subjecting the performers to instrumental use -- they merely are making instrumental use of the effigies of the performers, and not the performers themselves. Such responses are hardly convincing, given the many statistics that suggest the inability of consumers of large amounts of media materials -- especially teenagers -- to separate their experiences of such materials from their day-to-day lives. Fooling the audience for the sake of fantasy is the whole point of pornography, A deeper perusal of the literature would, I suspect, reveal that many of pornography's consumers are insufficiently sophisticated to draw robust distinctions between its fictional storylines and the sexual desires of real-world women.  As a result large numbers of non-consenting women are legitimately harmed by its cultural presence.

My own view is that what is going on here is that, at a practical level, Murray is finding it hard to sustain a methodology that is consistently contractarian, and as such that he is turning to other resources to arrive at his intended conclusions. So the more general result suggested by such examples is that when Murray speaks of the 'contractarian' view of particular practical ethics topics -- as he often does -- we ought probably to read him as meaning nothing more than that this is what happens to be his view, and that it is possible to marshal contractarian-style argumentation in its favor. Since, say, prominent contractarians from other times and places -- like Thomas Hobbes -- would have disagreed with virtually every one of this book's practical conclusions, it probably is overreach for Murray to say that contractarianism entails or requires such conclusions.

In sum, in spite of the difficulties I have listed, I consider this to be an insightful book. Its author is a man of good will, its ambition is impressive, and its broad application sections are a welcome addition to the overall corpus of contractarian literature. Since it reads like a series of philosophical editorials, it probably is not the best choice for professors who, in their graduate seminars, are looking for in-depth treatments of the practical topics it covers. But, at the same time, for those who are, say, on the lookout for fast-paced summaries that derive, from contractarian origins, arguments that are favorable to liberal ethical views, the book is likely to be a more satisfying text. As mentioned, although I am unconvinced by a lot of Murray's backstory about contractarianism's evolutionary origins, as well as by his tendency to shape his theoretical-level contractarianism to achieve his pre-existing practical goals, I do think that this book is to be commended for its demonstration of contractarianism's wide-ranging scope. Without a doubt, it is a meaningful contribution to an approach to ethics that has been revitalized over the last fifty years by the work of Rawls, Scanlon and, most importantly for Murray's purposes, Gauthier.