Morals from Motives

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Slote, Michael, Morals from Motives, Oxford University Press, 2001, 240 pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-513837-6.

Reviewed by N. Athanassoulis, University of Leeds


Michael Slote’s work is familiar to anyone with an interest in contemporary moral philosophy since he is one of the few contemporary thinkers to have formulated and defended a comprehensive account of an ethics of virtue. Slote’s previous work has been broadly based on Aristotelian ideas, although he has drawn an important distinction between agent-focused and agent-based theories of virtue. Agent-based theories are contrasted with agent-focused theories, which in turn are distinguished from other theories because their understanding of the ‘moral or ethical life’ is based on an understanding of the virtues as inner traits. Agent-based theories, on the other hand, are more radical in that the evaluation of actions is entirely derivative from and dependent on what we have to say ethically about the (inner life of) the agents who perform those actions. Slote has argued in previous work that moral facts emerge from moral motivation. In this new book he expands further on what it is for a moral theory to be agent-based but moves away from Aristotle towards a ‘sentimentalist’ theory of morality.

A sentimentalist, or warm agent-based account of the virtues puts a fundamental emphasis on a person’s motives and claims “that an act is morally acceptable if and only if it comes from good or virtuous motivation involving benevolence or caring (about the well-being of others) or at least doesn’t come from bad or inferior motivation involving malice or indifference to humanity” (38). The emphasis on motivation is fundamental in that it is not grounded in the good consequences such motives may bring about nor is it based on rules or principles. Rather “certain forms of overall motivation are, intuitively, morally good” (38). This concern with motivation and the grounding of the entire theory in benevolence represents a move for Slote away from Aristotelian virtue ethics, which focuses on character, including character in action, and the right reason as well as the right desire. Instead this latest account of agent-based virtue has more in common with the ethics of care, and Slote often discusses his ideas with reference to Gilligan, Noddings, et al.

Central in Slote’s account is the idea of universal benevolence or caring. Motives are judged not on whether they promote happiness, produce good consequences, or conform to principles, but rather on how well they approximate to the motive of universal benevolence, which is the highest and best of motives. The theory then is based on our sentiments of love and care, not just for those individuals who are near and dear to us, but also for those we don’t even know—for the whole of humanity. For Slote a person of virtue will care for those near and dear to her, for humanity and for herself. His theory also has an account of how it is possible to balance such concerns. Imagine the example of a father who loves both of his children but allots the effort and attention he pays to them depending on their particular needs. The father won’t do what promotes the overall good of the two children but may spend more time and effort helping the disabled and dependent child as opposed to the able-bodied and independent child. The virtuous agent achieves a similar balance between intimate caring for those near and dear and humanitarian caring for people in general in the same way that “equal concern for children by its very nature tends to lead a person to allot efforts and attention in a somewhat balanced way” (68). Balance between all our concerns then is the result of the nature of those concerns and the caring they involve.

This idea that care can extend beyond those we know to wider groups allows Slote to formulate his response to the criticism that an ethics of care allows no room for considerations of justice. The objection is that by focusing on those we care about we leave no room for considerations of justice, i.e. our obligations towards others. Slote tries to make room for justice within his theory by extending the group of people we care about. He introduces the idea that individuals can be concerned for their country and for other countries where all these concerns are balanced in the same way that our concerns for different individuals are balanced: “for just as we are morally supposed to care more about individuals who are ‘close’ to us, we are supposed to love or care about our own country more than other countries, and just as it is morally deplorable not to have a substantial concern for human beings generally, it is objectionable to treat the fate of other nations as a matter of practical attitudinal indifference” (94). All this is convincing according to Slote because “like our commonsense good opinion of caring more for people who are near and dear to us, our belief in the virtuousness of greater concern for the good of (the people of) one’s own country seems to need no grounding in other ethical considerations; it is an attitude that makes sense to us, that seems plausibly regarded as preferable to treating all countries alike” (94).

However, Slote’s claim that the appeal of benevolence needs no other grounding than the idea that as an attitude it makes sense to us is less than convincing. Slote is offering an account of a moral theory and fundamentally morality is normative. A moral account is an account of how we are obliged to behave, a right action is one we ought to pursue, and a good motive is one that it is recommended to have. If we ask Slote why we should cultivate the motive of benevolence, his answer is based on the motive of self-concern. Here is an example of how he derives the idea of concern for others from the idea of concern for oneself. Caring for other individuals is associated with the goods of love and friendship. Love and friendship are among life’s great goods, and a life without them is not a full and good one; and as “the motive of self-interest or self-concern as formulated above is a concern to have or attain a full and good life for oneself, and if such concern is endemic to practical rationality, we are now in a position to give a rational justification for the moral motivation of caring” (185). There are a number of problems with this account.

The motive of self-concern is represented as something we all have anyway. This means that morality is not about what we ought to do but about what we do anyway. As a result we should look to psychology to give us answers about the motives we already have rather than look to moral philosophy to answer the question of what motives we should have.

Furthermore, deriving the motive of care for others from the motive of self-concern misses the point. A concern for others which is ultimately based on concern for oneself is less than genuine and seems to miss out on what it means to genuinely care for others for their own sake. This leaves Slote’s theory exposed to the self-centeredness objection often leveled against virtue ethics (but successfully countered by some Aristotelians) and distorts the essence of our other-regarding obligations.

It also seems that a theory based on the motive of benevolence derived from self-concern also misses out on the demands of justice. Despite Slote’s efforts to account for this problem his theory is not able to incorporate the obligations generated by the demands of justice or take account of rights and duties. Rights, for example, are not simply generated by our concern for others, and a right may be validly claimed by someone we feel no concern towards. Furthermore our obligations with regard to how we should treat others can sometimes conflict with our concern for them. For example, I may be motivated to care for the student who will fail his course since he will be extremely distressed, will not be able to find a job etc., but the demands of justice mean that I must still give him the mark his work deserves.

There is also a problem with how all these different concerns balance out. Slote has given us the example of the father and also claims that “practical rationality requires that each person be concerned with having/attaining a full and good life, but also be capable of (exemplifying a) psychological balance between such self-concern and two kinds of non-instrumental concern (or care) about the well-being, the good lives, of others: concern for (the class of) those whose larger association with the person makes possible the goods of community and social groups generally” (187). However, he does not explain why this psychological balance is a rational requirement, and his account of love inherently reaching a balance is also unconvincing. Love on its own cannot make decisions between the competing demands of individuals; what is required is a judgment based on the merits of these demands, the desert of each person, the reasonableness of their claims, etc.

Moral from Motives is an original and ambitious attempt to formulate a different kind of virtue ethics. However, it seems to me that the theory still has to consider a number of questions and become more refined before it can rival alternative, Aristotelian-based accounts of virtue.