Mortal Imitations of Divine Life: The Nature of the Soul in Aristotle's De Anima

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Eli Diamond, Mortal Imitations of Divine Life: The Nature of the Soul in Aristotle's De Anima, Northwestern University Press, 2015, 333pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810130692.

Reviewed by Klaus Corcilius, University of California, Berkeley


This is a book not on Plato, as the main title might suggest, but on Aristotle's De anima (DA). Eli Diamond offers a reading of the DA as "quietly but constantly theological", according to which "mind" (41) is the formal and final cause of all kinds of soul (nutritive, perceptual, noetic). Each stage on the ascending series of kinds of soul described in DA II 3 is, as Diamond writes in his preface, the "very activity, which is God, though with starkly varying degrees of success." (xi). This is a thesis reminiscent of Plotinus Enn. III 8 (not mentioned by Diamond), but completely unacceptable as an interpretation of the text of the DA: there is no passage in the work, or indeed in the whole corpus, that would support that claim. It seems to me that Diamond misreads Aristotle's famous statement about how different genera of animate things try to attain immortality each in their own way and as far as this is possible for them in DA II 4, 415a23ff. as a claim about kinds of soul.

Meanwhile, saying that nous is the formal and final cause of other kinds of soul seems to make nonsense of Aristotle's science of living beings, which is based on a conception of kinds of soul as primary formal and final explanatory principles. How can anything be a first explanatory principle if it has "higher" formal and final causes? This seems a pressing question. Diamond, however, doesn't seem to be interested in explaining to the reader how he wishes to accommodate the science of living things in his theological interpretation. I found the arguments in this book for the abstruse claim that mind is the formal and final cause of the other kinds of soul imaginative but entirely unpersuasive, and I am not going to reproduce them here. But I should add that Diamond's pronouncements about "the modern interpreters" of the DA who all read the treatise in a "profoundly unsystematic" way (26), and about himself as the first to "articulate the completely systematic character of the treatise" (32) do not add to the persuasiveness of his arguments (similar boastful claims can be found, for instance, on pages 55 and 75). In view of this I shall limit myself to stating some of the reasons for my frustration with this book. I will be brief.

Diamond more than once makes imprecise, misleading, and sometimes even outright false assertions about Aristotle. One case in point, crucial for Diamond's overall argumentative goal, is the claim (p.62) that the causal definition of the soul in DA II 2 applies to the causes of the lower faculties ("kinds") of soul. This is misleading because it suggests a false picture of DA II 2 sqq., according to which these chapters investigate the causes of the kinds of soul. But this is precisely what Diamond wants us to persuade us of. He writes "the definition we are now seeking is the one that gives the cause of soul" (53). But the DA, far from stating the causes of different kinds of soul, defines different kinds (or parts) of the soul in order to lay the foundation of Aristotle's science of living things. In this science these definitions are supposed to function as the primary explanatory principles of the per se features of living things insofar as they are alive (cp. 414a13, 402a7-11).

Diamond doesn't explain to us how kinds of soul can serve as explanatory first principles, as Aristotle says they do, and at the same time have other and higher (formal and final) causes. Aristotle, as far as I know, nowhere says or implies that the nutritive soul is nous and he doesn't say that the nutritive soul is for the sake of the perceptual soul or that both are for the sake of nous either. What he says in II 3 is rather that in living beings that possess a plurality of soul parts, the lower capacities are necessary for, and thus also teleologically subordinated to, the higher parts. Could it be that Diamond confuses kinds of animate beings with kinds of soul? It is one thing to say that in a living animal equipped with the capacity for perception and thought the former is for the sake of the latter; it is quite another to say that perception, the essence of animals, is for the sake of something else, i.e. thought. To speak of nous as consciousness is misleading, and to speak of Aristotle's God as a self-mover (6) is to speak falsely. It should at least have given Diamond pause. Could Aristotle consistently have thought of God as a subject of motion and hence as having spatial extension? But Diamond goes even further and uses this claim for an argument in which he tries to show that Aristotle's account of animal self-motion in DA III 9-11 is somehow meant to correspond to the paradigm of God's self-moving activity (221ff.).

Further, the argument heavily depends on controversial claims Diamond adopts from the secondary literature. Among his main heroes are Aryeh Kosman, Christopher Shields, and Jessica Moss. Of course, these authors are not responsible for what their interpreters write. Diamond, at any rate, uncritically, and to my mind at least also somewhat unthinkingly, adopts some of their most controversial contentions and mixes them together into a new one. Thus, Kosman's Spinozist interpretation of Aristotle's God as nature, Shields' claim of the core-dependent homonomy of the kinds of soul, and Moss's view of desire as a form of cognition all come together in support of the argument for nous as the formal and final cause of other kinds of soul. The result is confusion.

This brings me to what is at the heart of my frustration with Diamond's book. There is a very pertinent question of how passages like DA II 4, 415a23ff., or De Caelo II 12, which reflect on how the different activities of the genera of living things relate to the eternal and the divine, are to be squared with Aristotle's scientific attitude towards the explanation of living things. However, Diamond approaches these matters with the sledgehammer, i.e. by simply ignoring the methodological underpinnings of Aristotle's science of living things (there is, for example, no discussion of the exclusion of nous from natural science in PA I 1 nor is there discussion of the more recent attempts at interpreting Aristotle's zoology and DA from the perspective of the Posterior Analytics). The interpretive problem of how to reconcile Aristotle's science of living things with his theology is not adequately addressed by a raving Platonic interpretation of Aristotle's DA, but by giving a coherent account of the coexistence of two different methodological approaches in one and the same author, one of which is specific to given scientific domains, the other a global across genera investigation from a metaphysical viewpoint. This book misses that opportunity.