Moses Mendelssohn: Writings on Judaism, Christianity, and the Bible

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Micah Gottlieb (ed.), Moses Mendelssohn: Writings on Judaism, Christianity, and the Bible, Curtis Bowman, Elias Sacks, and Allan Arkush (trs.), Brandeis University Press, 2011, 267pp., $26.00 (pbk), 9781584656852.

Reviewed by Robert Erlewine, Illinois Wesleyan University


Moses Mendelssohn is a fascinating figure who is sadly often regarded as having marginal importance for research. Despite his monumental historical significance, Mendelssohn's thought has not been as thoroughly explored as it might. In Jewish studies, he is often considered significant for inaugurating modern Jewish thought, but his work is hardly studied by scholars with the same regularity as Franz Rosenzweig or Emmanuel Levinas. In philosophy, he is likewise seen as historically significant, as a contemporary of Kant and as a participant in the Pantheismusstreit which galvanized the nineteenth century and the development of German Idealism. There are signs over the last two decades that Mendelssohn's thought is now being seen as having intrinsic value. Indeed, one might speak of something of a veritable renascence in Mendelssohn studies in the past two decades: new biographies, new translations, monographs devoted to his philosophy, and works that emphasize his profound influence on later German thought and connect him to an array of thinkers ranging from Spinoza to Cavell.

Gottlieb's collection of translations (all new, with the exception of a slightly emended version of Allan Arkush's translation of the second part of the 1783 Jerusalem) provides invaluable assistance for scholars and students in overcoming one of the biggest obstacles to grasping Mendelssohn's significance, which is the wide range and diffuseness of his work. While many Enlightenment intellectuals wrote for many different audiences and in many different styles, Mendelssohn, as the first emancipated Jew, simultaneously engages so many different venues it is dizzying. He was an important Aufklärer, aesthetician, philosopher of religion, polemicist, and champion of Jewish rights. By bringing his diverse writings together -- with excerpts from his German and Hebrew writings, often translated into English for the first time -- to sit next to each other, the unity of his underlying philosophical commitments is unmistakable.

The volume is laid out thematically. Section I, which takes up the bulk of the book, is titled "Polemical Writings" and contains works relating to the various controversies with German thinkers with which Mendelssohn was engaged. This section is laid out chronologically into three sections. It begins with "The Lavater Affair and Related Documents (1769-1773)," in which a Christian theologian challenged Mendelssohn to publicly refute the recent work of a respected Christian philosopher or convert. The second section, "Jerusalem and Related Documents (1782-1783)" includes, among other documents, Mendelssohn's preface to the translation of Vindiciae Judaeorum as well as the two open letters that, at least in part, provoked Mendelssohn to write his most famous work, Jerusalem, or on Religious Power and Judaism. Bringing these provocative letters and the bulk of Jerusalem together is helpful for instruction, as it brings all the sources involved in teaching this text together in one source. (Of course, one might lament the decision to exclude most of book I of Jerusalem.) Finally, this section culminates with "The Pantheism Controversy (1785-1786)," the famous conflict between Mendelssohn and Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi over whether or not Lessing was in fact a Spinozist, a dispute which electrified the intelligentsia of Germany in the nineteenth century.

Section II is titled "Writings on the Bible." These works, which are either taken from letters or are translated from his Hebrew writings, will be quite helpful for classroom purposes and for scholars who do not read Hebrew. Such writings reveal that Mendelssohn was not merely defensively performing for Christians when he insisted that the Jewish tradition could be squared with Enlightenment beliefs. Here we see Mendelssohn reflect on biblical passages using medieval Jewish philosophers and authoritative exegetes to reach the conclusions that harmonize with his philosophical reflections rooted in Leibniz and Wolff. Gottlieb annotates these texts with great care, rendering them accessible to scholars without knowledge of the Jewish exegetical tradition.

The final section, titled "Miscellany," brings together many of Mendelssohn's famous metaphysical arguments from various works, many here translated for the first time. Whether it is justifications for the study of logic to a traditionalist Jewish audience, or various proofs of God's existence, the immortality of the soul, or Mendelssohn's input on the debates about miracles, these carefully selected works help us appreciate why Mendelssohn was one of the most widely read philosophers of the Enlightenment. His arguments are careful and thoughtful.

There is no doubt this work will be of great interest to scholars in Jewish studies. Mendelssohn's Jerusalem is frequently taught in surveys of modern Jewish history and philosophy, and Gottlieb's work offers a great deal to situate and enrich this experience. Mendelssohn is not only the first modern Jewish philosopher (depending on how one views Spinoza), but he sought to marry enlightened philosophy and Judaism, a move that has been alternatively lambasted, lamented, and celebrated in later Jewish thought and culture. His struggles with the rabbis to decentralize Jewish authority and modernize Judaism, as well as his very public battles with Christian theologians and philosophers about the emancipation of the Jews and religious toleration, set the agenda for later Jewish thought and culture in Western Europe. In short, whatever one feels about him, it is very difficult to talk about modern European Judaism without talking about him. Thus, the more information one can make accessible to both scholars and students the better.

One hopes that this work will also be widely read by philosophers. Clearly there is evidence that Mendelssohn's metaphysical writings continue to interest philosophers. In recent years there have been translations of his writings on aesthetics (Philosophical Writings [1997] by Daniel O. Dahlstrom), and two new translations of Morning Hours: Lectures on the Existence of God (one by Dahlstrom and Corey Dyck, and another in the forthcoming Last Works, translated by Bruce Rosenstock alongside To the Friends of Lessing). The abstraction of these works, dealing with God's existence and nature, means that they can be integrated easily into standard courses in philosophy of religion. They are also helpful for courses in modern philosophy and German idealism. The works in Gottlieb's volume, however, are primarily devoted to the relationship between Judaism and Christianity, whose context should not be ignored for the sake of abstract arguments whose merits can be assessed without regard to history. While philosophy is often characterized in largely ahistorical terms, I would like to suggest it is precisely the historical specificity of these texts that make them so valuable. Given all the recent attention to secularism and the changing sensibilities which accompany shifts in modernity -- conversations in which Judaism is almost entirely absent -- Mendelssohn's work is an invaluable resource. Reading Charles Taylor's A Secular Age, one gets the impression that Jews had virtually nothing to do with Christian Europe and certainly exerted little influence in its intellectual and conceptual development. And yet, as with the many gaps in this otherwise remarkable work, one cannot tell the story of the modernization of the North Atlantic or European world without discussing the philosophical, theological, and political anxieties resulting from the question of the emancipation of the Jews. These were matters that non-Jewish, European philosophers and cultural luminaries spoke about at great length and certainly played an essential role in the transformation of intellectual and spiritual transformations that Taylor seeks to narrate.

However, we should not merely read Mendelssohn to get a sense of what the arguments surrounding the call for emancipation looked like, or how they influenced later thought and sensibilities. Rather, to use the language of Jürgen Habermas, Mendelssohn's thought brings to light a profound philosophical effort to grapple with and facilitate the "adaptation" that "religious consciousness is forced to undergo" in modernity, when religion ceases to function as a "'worldview' or 'comprehensive doctrine' . . . in the sense that it claims the authority to structure a form of life as a whole."[1] Even with his metaphysical commitments -- his natural theology and his account of Judaism that is more recalcitrant to reason and argument -- Mendelssohn's thought brings Habermas's abstract account of "modern faith" to life and gives it concreteness. Habermas argues that the conditions of modernity place epistemic demands on religions such that they shift towards postures of "modern faith," which allows them "to stabilize the inclusive attitude that it assumes within a universe of discourse delimited by secular knowledge and shared with other religions."[2] Mendelssohn, beset by cultured despisers, appeals to such a notion or something remarkably like it in his attempt to defend Judaism and the Enlightenment against chiliastic and Romantic theologians and nationalists.

Indeed, Mendelssohn's calls for parity and for inclusive attitudes that recognize legitimate plurality came from an embattled position. It is in this regard that Gottlieb's decision to include works from Mendelssohn's adversaries -- whether the dedication from Johann Caspar Lavater, the open letters from Cranz and Mörschel that occasioned Jerusalem, or sections from Jacobi's On the Doctrine of Spinoza -- is to be commended. After translating the work of Swiss scientist and philosopher Charles Bonnet into German, Lavater implored Mendelssohn to

not read this work with philosophical impartiality . . . but rather to refute it publically, provided that you do not find the essential arguments in support of the facts of Christianity to be correct. If, however, you find them to be correct, I ask and implore you to do what prudence, love of truth, and honesty command you to do -- whatSocrates would have done if he had read this work and found it irrefutable. (p. 5)

This is a particularly charged attack, as Mendelssohn had recently written a widely read book on the immortality of the soul (Phädon) using Socrates as his mouthpiece. Thus, Mendelssohn's very character is brought into this philosophical debate. How could Mendelssohn, the Jew, reject such proofs that are grounded in Christian belief without calling Christianity itself false? Obviously such a move would have destroyed Mendelssohn's reputation. But more is at stake here. What is at issue is how to talk about religious disagreement without calling one's neighbor an idolator or a fool.

Mendelssohn sought to deflect Lavater's challenge by insisting on parity between believers: "I am as firmly and irrefutably convinced about what is essential to my religion as you or Mr. Bonnet can be about yours." (p. 8) Mendelssohn readily acknowledged the brilliance of many Christians. Indeed, as Gottlieb points out, Mendelssohn cherished the works of Locke, Leibniz and Wolff. (p. xiii) However, even if he granted their philosophical superiority, he also delimited it: "But I cannot judge the truth on the basis of the views of other people. If I am to accept, reject, or defer judging a proposition, I must do so on its own." (p. 19) Indeed, Mendelssohn thinks that cultural difference plays a large role in philosophical disagreement, as many of our judgments are rooted in customs and received opinions, and therefore disagreement is inevitable. Thus on the one hand, Mendelssohn acknowledged "On a great many religious and philosophical points I have, in relation to myself, dogmatically taken the side of my camp, and I do not believe I could ever alter my principles." Yet on the other, he insisted that everyone else be given "the same right that I claim for myself." (p. 24) Mendelssohn's ability to respect those he disagrees with can be seen in the fact that, even in his Hebrew writings, he did not begrudge Christians their translations of the Hebrew Bible, which undoubtedly conflict with Jewish understandings of the text. Rather, he insisted that for this very reason, Jews needed to produce their own. (p. 196)

To be sure, Mendelssohn's metaphysical commitments are thicker than Habermas's, believing that human beings are meant for eternal felicity, and that divine providence insures that this will ultimately be met. However, he vigorously protested attempts to unify faith. In the moving sentences that close Jerusalem ("Let no one in your states be a searcher of hearts and a judge of thoughts; let no one assume a right that the Omniscient has reserved to himself alone!" [p. 193]), Mendelssohn puts forward the possibility of an overlapping consensus that is more than a modus vivendi. In Mendelssohn's work we see the germ of a powerful Enlightenment tradition that promotes religious tolerance not as a second-order virtue, but as part of the very plan of divinity itself.

Gottlieb has chosen outstanding texts to include in this volume, which are certain to be of interest to anyone with even a passing interest in Mendelssohn or the Enlightenment. Indeed, I suspect this work will become the new standard volume for those teaching Mendelssohn. He provides helpful introductions and annotations to the works in question, making even Mendelssohn's more technical works on Jewish exegesis accessible to philosophers with no training in Jewish Studies. The one quibble that I take with Gottlieb's editorial work is that he could have done more to introduce the wide range of Mendelssohn scholarship that has emerged in the English speaking world in the last two decades. While his treatment of Mendelssohn's life is admirable, clear, and insightful, he only discusses monographs that are dedicated solely to Mendelssohn and offers references to only a handful of important articles. That being said, a volume such as this is long overdue, and hopefully a new appreciation of Mendelssohn will follow in its wake.

[1] Jürgen Habermas, Between Naturalism and Religion, (Cambridge, UK: Polity, 2008), p. 112.

[2] Eduardo Mendieta, ed., Habermas, Religion and Rationality: Essays on Reason, God, and Morality. (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 2002), p. 150.