Moses Mendelssohn's Living Script: Philosophy, Practice, History, Judaism

Placeholder book cover

Elias Sacks, Moses Mendelssohn's Living Script: Philosophy, Practice, History, Judaism, Indiana University Press, 2017, 316pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253023742.

Reviewed by Corey W. Dyck, Western University/Martin-Luther-Universität Halle-Wittenberg


In 1783, Moses Mendelssohn (1729-1786) published his Jerusalem: or on Religious Power and Judaism, an extended argument for the limits of the state and religion with respect to individual conscience, as well as an impassioned defense of the reasonability and modernity of Jewish religious practice. In connection with his discussion of the latter in the second part of Jerusalem, Mendelssohn writes:

The ceremonial law itself is a kind of living script, rousing the mind and heart, full of meaning, never ceasing to inspire contemplation and to provide the occasion and opportunity for oral instruction. What a student did and saw being done from morning till night pointed to religious doctrines and convictions.[1]

Evidently referring to the halakhah, or to the system of (613) precepts and rituals guiding Jewish practice given in the Torah, Mendelssohn commends it as effecting an instructive connection between even mundane activities and eternal spiritual truths. In addition, Mendelssohn is widely taken to argue that the "living script" comprising the actions of the Jewish people is preferable, from the perspective of the student, to a (dead) script consisting of written symbols, since only the former combats the mind's tendency to idolatry, that is, the elevation of artificial signs to something important in themselves.[2]

In his book, by contrast, Elias Sacks argues that the real force of Mendelssohn's emphasis on the "living script" is that it addresses historically-grounded challenges to Jewish spiritual life. Sacks identifies three such challenges: first, the danger of a "conceptual disfiguring" of Jewish beliefs through marrying them to philosophical modes of expression which are in a state of constant change and instability; second, the (social-historical) threat of society evolving in ways that threaten human flourishing and political harmony; and third, the (historical-critical) threat posed to the authority of the Bible.

After summarizing these challenges in the first chapter, Sacks in Chapter 2 considers how Mendelssohn's notion of a living script specifically responds to the first threat. Mendelssohn himself is clear in warning against "words and characters which invariably present the same rigid forms, into which we cannot force our concepts without disfiguring them,"[3] and Sacks takes Mendelssohn's emphasis on ritualized practice to avoid this disfiguring by discouraging "fixed verbal formulas" and thereby encouraging a kind of "conceptual flexibility" (p. 63), as (shifting) expressions are accommodated to (fixed) beliefs rather than the other way around. The additional flexibility allows for the revision and refinement of the (philosophical) expression of key religious principles and concepts as philosophical frameworks are taken up and later rejected in favour of others, in what is for Mendelssohn a continual cycle of philosophical revolution and reconstruction.

One of Mendelssohn's motivating concerns for this view, on Sacks' telling, is the perennial change within philosophy and the then-current state of "anarchy" within academic philosophy. Sacks cites plenty of textual evidence for Mendelssohn's appreciation of past displacements in the history of philosophy (such as that of Aristotle by Descartes), as well as evidence for his eminent dissatisfaction with the current shabby reputation of philosophy and widespread rejection of metaphysics (in the wake of Wolff's death). Nonetheless, it is difficult to cobble together a principled view on the history of philosophy from these occasional judgments on Mendelssohn's part, and a closer consideration of some of the key pieces of evidence offered by Sacks arguably leads us in a rather different direction.

For instance, in Mendelssohn's claim that "Descartes drove out the Scholastics, Wolff drove out Descartes, and the contempt for all philosophy eventually drove out Wolff,"[4] the current state of philosophy is not simply the latest in a line of continuous philosophical change (the continual refinement, for instance, of inherently woolly artificial signs) but a novel and radical challenge to the relevance and importance of philosophy as such. Moreover, Mendelssohn takes specific issue with the neglect of metaphysics, framing the second of his Philosophical Dialogues with a lament for this "former queen of the sciences" and a reaffirmation of its fundamental importance.[5] Mendelssohn even holds out hope that the "all-destroying Kant," the highest-profile symptom of this larger problem, will "rebuild with the same spirit with which he has torn down," indicating a desire for a return to metaphysics' former glory rather than something altogether new or different.[6] This is to say that there is good reason to think that Mendelssohn viewed the current philosophical situation as an aberration and, consequently, that he thought that further philosophical change along these lines (which is to say away from Leibnizian-Wolffian metaphysics) was to be resisted rather than encouraged, much less adapted to.

Sacks turns, in Chapter 3, to showing how Jewish practice serves to counter the development of society in ways that are harmful to the individual's end of promoting his own and others' perfection. Sacks notes that in Jerusalem Mendelssohn emphasizes the utility of reflection on the eternal truths for the "felicity of the nation," though Mendelssohn does not there explain precisely what this connection might be. Drawing upon Mendelssohn's Hebrew writings, and particularly on the commentary (Bi'ur) on Exodus, Sacks contends that Mendelssohn's discussion of God's mandate to the Israelites to construct a tabernacle fills in the gap. It does this by illustrating how the communal task of building a structure for worship served to link the various mundane deeds performed in service of that building into occasions for reflecting on God. These reflections naturally engender an abiding understanding of the distinction between good and evil which, when combined with Mendelssohn's ethical intellectualism (in the mode of the Leibnizian-Wolffian school), yield a desire for the good and, ultimately, virtuous actions. In this way, Sacks effectively uses Mendelssohn's religious text to elucidate and complement Mendelssohn's philosophical argument, a use that might serve as a model for the integration of Mendelssohn's German and Hebrew writings.

However, Sacks is less successful in this respect in Chapter 4, where he turns to Mendelssohn's defense of the Bible's authority for modern Jews in spite of historically-grounded challenges, such as that inaugurated by Spinoza in the Tractatus Theologico-Politicus. According to these challenges, Jewish practice is undermined by its reliance upon the Bible, as a historically-conditioned document subject to manifold corruptions as its text was transmitted (orally, then in written form) over time, and upon potentially unreliable rabbinic hermeneutics. Sacks takes Mendelssohn to draw on Leibniz's discussion of the mysteries in the Theodicy to show that there is sufficient epistemic warrant to uphold the reliability of Scripture and rabbinic interpretation. According to Sacks, Leibniz argues, first, that we have warrant to provisionally accept the account of the mysteries given in Scripture as a result of the independent demonstration of the truth of the Christian religion and the content of its teachings (which show it to "preserve a divine revelation" -- p. 145) and, second, that we are licensed in actually accepting the truth of the mysteries inasmuch as no decisive (i.e., more than merely morally certain) objection can be levelled against them.

Sacks insists that this constitutes a "substantive" response to the Spinozan threat, at least from the perspective of his contemporaries (p. 123-4). However, even by this (presumably lower) standard it is difficult to imagine Mendelssohn's argument being convincing. First, Sacks does not address the obvious disanalogy between Leibniz's and Mendelssohn's discussion. In the passages Sacks discusses, Leibniz is interested in vindicating the content of a specific doctrine against the charge that it is irrational (not that it is not grounded in Scripture); Mendelssohn by contrast is trying to vindicate the reliability of the very medium through which all such doctrines are communicated (independent of whatever content they might have). As a result, it is not clear that Leibniz's discussion is even relevant to the challenge Sacks identifies.

Moreover, such a response would not have been convincing to Mendelssohn's more philosophically up-to-date contemporaries. Part of what is at stake, of course, is the reliability of testimony, including but not limited to the occurrence of miracles. Yet, an argument of the sort derived from Leibniz is hardly effective in addressing this, not only considered in light of Hume's own formidable challenge in the Enquiry (with which Mendelssohn was familiar), but also in light of the surprisingly sophisticated treatment of beliefs based upon testimony within the broader Leibnizian-Wolffian tradition.[7] It might be that (consistent with his other discussions of Hume, for instance) Mendelssohn simply did not take the philosophical challenges to the reliability of testimony seriously,[8] but some of his contemporaries certainly did and, given that, the argument Sacks attributes to Mendelssohn could only have had a rhetorical effectiveness, even when considered within Mendelssohn's historical context.

In Chapter 5, Sacks turns to drawing the implications of the foregoing regarding Mendelssohn's thought, particularly regarding the importance of history, though as suggested by my comments above I remain unconvinced that history plays such a "far-reaching role" (p. 19), at least in Mendelssohn's philosophical works. While Sacks' study might thus fall short of its broader ambitions, it is arguably more successful in making the case for the relevance of Mendelssohn's religious (Hebrew) writings for the interpretation and contextualization of his philosophical (German) texts, though it also seems clear that any such use of the former must be guided by an appreciation of Mendelssohn's superior philosophical talent and rigour.


My thanks to Avi Lifschitz for comments on an earlier draft.


[1] Mendelssohn, Jerusalem, or On Religious Power and Judaism, trans. by Allan Arkush (1983), pp. 102-3.

[2] For a recent, detailed account of this, and a consideration of its consequences for Mendelssohn's Judaism, see Gideon Freudenthal, No Religion without Idolatry: Mendelssohn's Jewish Enlightenment (2012).

[3] Jerusalem, 102.

[4] Briefe, die neueste Litteratur betreffend (9. Mar. 1759), p. 130 -- emphasis mine. The passage is also cited by Sacks on p. 61.

[5] See Mendelssohn, Philosophical Writings, ed. and trans. by Daniel O. Dahlstrom (1997), p. 105.

[6] Morning Hours: Lectures on God's Existence, trans. by Daniel O. Dahlstrom and Corey W. Dyck (2011), p. xx.

[7] For an overview, see Axel Gelfert, "Kant and the Enlightenment's Contribution to Social Epistemology" in Episteme 7 (2010), pp. 79-99, especially pp. 82-8.

[8] Mendelssohn discusses this topic in Jerusalem, pp. 92-4, in connection with his distinction between eternal and historical truths. His contention that God sometimes resorts to miracles in order "to confirm authority and credibility" of witnesses would of course be rather limited in its effectiveness in addressing Hume's challenge.