Motivation Ethics

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Mathew Coakley, Motivation Ethics, Bloomsbury, 2017, 258pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781350004597.

Reviewed by Erica Lucast Stonestreet, College of St. Benedict/St. John's University


Mathew Coakley presents a moral theory that combines the consequentialist premise that the moral good is the overall good with the Kantian and virtue theories' premise that the primary object of evaluation should be the agent. "Motivation ethics" is the view that "Agents are morally better the more motivated they are to promote the [overall] good" (59). He argues that only theories that base evaluations of actions or institutions on the evaluation of agents can avoid a range of problems including, most prominently, arbitrariness. The arguments are designed to avoid relying on intuitions, standing instead on theoretical constraints including evaluative coherence (between action judgments and agent judgments) and non-arbitrariness. For this reason, the book is logically clear and thorough, written in the detached, occasionally formalized style that characterizes much of analytic philosophy. Whether the theory will ultimately be attractive to readers probably depends on the extent to which they accept promotion of the overall good as the moral good.

Coakley begins by arguing that consequentialism (of all stripes) founders on what he calls the "moral agent problem." The moral agent problem is essentially that a theory that places the locus of evaluation on actions rather than agents cannot provide a satisfactory account of what makes an agent morally good or bad.

Coakley argues that consequentialism is committed to four things, which, taken together, are incompatible:

1. Human agents can be evaluated.
2. The moral evaluation of an agent and her actual or expected actions should roughly cohere.
3. The correct moral evaluation of an agent should be determined by features of the agent (and not arbitrarily).
4. The right act (motive, virtue, rule, or combination) is that which will lead to the best actual or expected consequences.

Coakley argues that if we accept (1), (2), and (4), then (3) cannot be true. If you take a given agent with certain motivations, beliefs, and dispositions, then whether or not she acts rightly (i.e. brings about the best consequences) is going to depend on what circumstances she finds herself in: given one kind of life, her features may cause her to act mostly rightly, but given a different kind of life, those same features may cause her to act wrongly. But if our evaluation of her as an agent is based on the results of her actions, then whether we judge her to be a good or bad person is based not on her features but on her circumstances -- over which she does not have full control. Hence our moral evaluation of her as a person is contingent on something arbitrary.

I wonder, though, whether the arbitrariness worry runs even deeper than this. Our motivational features are highly contingent on upbringing and environment, and to that extent they too are arbitrary. Because of this, it seems possible to run a parallel argument against any agent-centered theory, though I don't have space to do it here. This would not bode well for moral theory in general. The alternative may be to say that both motivation and environment are, to some extent, within our control, thus rescuing all moral theories -- including consequentialism -- from total arbitrariness.

Coakley sets out his positive theory by rejecting (4) and making the evaluation of the agent primary: agents are morally good to the extent that they are motivated to promote the aggregated good of all concerned, and good actions are therefore the ones that morally motivated agents perform. Motivation ethics derives judgments of actions, duties, and moral progress from the core idea that it is not actions, but agents we should judge. This basic idea strikes me as sound.

In Chapter 3, Coakley argues that although some kinds of deontology can overcome the moral agent problem, they run into a different one: it seems hard to justify using the good of the particular others you happen to encounter rather than the good of all as the moral motivation. If a harm to someone you happen to encounter is bad, then more harms are worse, because everybody matters -- thus motivating the move to the good of all. I'm skeptical here, because it looks like we can run a parallel argument against using the good of all: doing so treats each person as a means to everyone else's good. If everyone is important, then treating everyone as a means to the overall good undermines the very motivation that got it going. Now, "everyone is important" can mean different things: perhaps the "good of all" theorists will read this as "everyone can be harmed," whereas theorists favoring deontological constraints will say "everyone has inherent dignity" -- thus exposing a fundamental difference in premises that nothing in Coakley's argument addresses.

Chapter 4 tackles the classic "demandingness objection" to consequentialism: the worry that the theory cannot be correct because it demands more of us than normal human beings can be expected to do. Coakley points out that this is an absolutist standard: any agent who fails to do everything he can to promote the good is not a morally good agent, even if he is doing extraordinary things compared to the rest of us. By contrast, on a comparativist standard, someone who does a lot more than most of us will be judged as we typically judge such people: as morally exemplary. Thus, a theory (like motivation ethics) that uses a comparativist standard will avoid the demandingness problem.

Coakley tackles the "problem of special relationships" in Chapter 5. Relationships to family and friends tend to motivate us to promote the good of these significant others over the good of all, and thus make us look morally bad. He pinpoints the problem as hinging once again on the evaluation of actions rather than agents, and thus argues that motivation ethics need not run afoul of it. Coakley formalizes the problem as another tetralemma:

1. Having special relationships entails that an agent will generally undertake actions that reflect an unequal concern for all.
2. An agent is not morally bad for having special relationships.
3. Moral evaluations of actions and agents should roughly cohere.
4. The morally right action is that which reflects equal concern for all.

Coakley proceeds as usual, giving arguments why we should not reject (1)-(3), and instead reject (4) and replace it with the motivation ethics definition of good action. He argues that although motivation ethics evaluates agents on their motivation to promote the overall good, it does not require that the agent not have other possible motivations (such as those resulting from special relationships). So the motivation ethics claim is really that an action is morally good if it "would be undertaken given a significant motivation to further the good of others, but potentially with other non-moral motivations too" (143, emphasis original). I'm not entirely sure what's being claimed here, but I think the best interpretation is that it's okay to be partial to someone unless being moderately motivated to promote the overall good rules it out. This may strike some (especially feminists) as a nonstarter: if a theory has to address relationships as a problem, even if it can solve the problem, it is fundamentally flawed.

Indeed, I find the arguments in this chapter much more tenuous than elsewhere. Consider one of Coakley's examples. A woman faces a situation where she can rescue one of two rowboats threatened by a storm at sea. One contains six strangers, the other four family members. Motivation ethics says that she should go for the boat of six. But "If her love for her family is strong, saving them might not . . . be to act morally badly. . . . Saving the six strangers, despite her love for her family, would be to act in a morally exceptional manner" (143). This strikes me as something along the lines of Bernard Williams' "one thought too many," and it could also draw criticism similar to Susan Wolf's objections to moral saints. If our theory is telling us that it's not necessarily morally bad to save our family over others, it has things backwards from ordinary human experience. These objections will have no traction with Coakley to the extent that they're based on intuition, but they may bother many readers.

Coakley claims it as an advantage of his theory that it separates moral motivation from the motivations engendered by these special relationships. I take it the idea is that it's one thing to evaluate someone as a parent or as a friend, but another to evaluate them as a moral agent. Coakley is worried about people who are good parents, but not morally motivated more generally -- e.g. drug dealers or gangsters, often portrayed as fiercely loyal to their own people but otherwise leading immoral lives. It's hard to render an overall judgment of a person, so by separating out the different roles from which we could act, we get some clarity. This puts theoretical clarity above verisimilitude, but if intuitions are ruled out, this won't matter.

Nevertheless, there is something else troubling about putting special relationships outside the scope of morality. It overlooks where our moral motivations come from in the first place, and this is a problem not only for those who think special relationships fall within the scope of morality, but on the theory's own terms. Suppose we grant that the good of all is the sole constituent of true moral motivation. Our moral development is deeply shaped by the relationships that form our world from the very beginning. As recent work in psychology shows, if these relationships go badly, we will be less motivated to promote the good of all. Presumably motivation ethics says it is a moral duty to foster this motivation in children. But the best way of doing this is -- empirical evidence shows -- to develop precisely the kind of special relationship that is at issue here. Being motivated by the good of all to foster the same motivation in children isn't the right sort of motivation to succeed in the task. And since someone motivated by the good of all will care about succeeding (as Coakley insists), then she should cultivate (supposedly) non-moral motivations in herself. Thus an activity with deep moral implications is a non-moral activity.

Coakley tries to tackle an objection like this on page 144. His response, though, is that motivation ethics "partly" accounts for the apparently moral motivation of parents (and others) because caring for family is evidence of a general concern for others. He introduces the idea of a "quasi-moral" duty, in which the agent is to do what an agent significantly motivated to promote the good of others would do, even if the agent doesn't actually have that motivation in doing it. It is unclear to me how this is a response to the worry. It would make more sense to say that parental and friendly duties are quasi-moral because they require concern for others but not for everybody, but (as far as I can tell) this isn't the move he makes.

Chapter 6 turns to the way motivation ethics interacts with moral duties in the political arena. It focuses on a puzzle that arises between what Coakley calls "cosmopolitans," who stress that we owe equal moral duties to people all over the world, and "political-associationists," who claim that we owe additional duties to co-nationals. As he puts it, claiming that we owe goods like health, education, and social security "internationally seems breathtakingly radical, but at the same time to say that we owe more moral concern to co-nationals is hard to justify" (151).

His solution to this problem takes a familiar shape. He shows that the problem stems from judging actions rather than judging agents, because when you focus on the goodness of actions, your evaluations are severed from the features of the agent. They thus face the kinds of problems discussed throughout the book. When we change the focus of evaluation to agents, however, we overcome this problem and better reflect actual human motivations.

Chapter 7 addresses a puzzle about the concept of procedural legitimacy as a way of justifying governmental coercive force. The idea is that governmental action is justified either by the goodness of the actions, or by the legitimacy of the government. But legitimacy only makes a difference when it commands its citizens to perform actions that are unjustified from the point of view of the good of all; otherwise, its verdicts are the same as for a good-based approach. So why would we want to use legitimacy, when it only makes a difference by promoting outcomes that are bad? That is, a legitimacy theory needs to "show why a legitimate state being normatively justified in doing X is desirable if it is morally undesirable that states in general should do X" (167). Coakley identifies six possible justifications and shows why all of them run into problems.

In Chapter 8, Coakley addresses the problem of interpersonal comparisons of the good, which is the skeptical suggestion that it's impossible to make sense of the idea of the overall welfare. Since overall welfare is central to motivation ethics, if successful, this is a very problematic worry. But Coakley argues, convincingly, that it isn't. He treats the issue as an epistemic problem, showing by analogy that all three of the major worries about interpersonal comparisons can be overcome. The idea is that in empirical cases where all we have is individual rankings, we can nevertheless form justified beliefs on the overall rankings of whatever is being measured (in his example, lengths of words and lengths of string). He argues that the welfare situation is analogous, concluding that we can indeed make sense of the concept of overall good, though we must remain appropriately epistemically humble.

The book closes with an epilogue that fleshes out a general principle of non-arbitrariness and speculates about the possibility of coming up with such a principle that would operate in both the normative and epistemic realm.

As readers of this review will no doubt have inferred, I think the book does reasonably well at what it sets out to do if you accept the premises. But I remain skeptical about the premise that "the" good is the overall good, since this treats people as a means to others' good and makes relationships into a problem. Coakley claims that the theory takes better account of human nature and motivation than at least consequentialism, and this seems right, but in my opinion it is not enough to be convincing.