Motivational Internalism

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Gunnar Björnsson, Caj Strandberg, Ragnar Francén Olinder, John Eriksson, and Fredrik Björklund (eds.), Motivational Internalism, Oxford University Press, 2015, 306pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199367955.

Reviewed by Nathaniel Sharadin, University of Syracuse


Motivational Internalism is a collection of thirteen new essays on exactly the topic you expect it to be, given the title. It also contains an introductory chapter, in which the editors attach an excellent overview of the current state of play to an intimidating bibliography. The essays in the volume are divided into three sections, each with its own, shorter, introduction by the editors. The first section concerns evidence for and against motivational internalism; the second concerns the relevance of internalism for metaethics; the final section considers ways of bridging the gap between internalist and externalist accounts of moral motivation. In what follows I'll comment briefly on each of the essays in these sections before remarking on who, besides libraries, should buy this book.

According to Michael Smith (''Evaluative Judgments, Judgments about Reasons, and Motivations''), there is an argument for motivational internalism buried in Scanlon's work on judgment-sensitive attitudes and buck-passing. But after digging it up, Smith, wielding Hume, quickly kills it all over again. This argument (and the related argument from Judith Thomson's too often overlooked work in Normativity) is interesting in its own right, whatever its prospects, and Smith's discussion of it is predictably clear. Although Smith does not offer his own positive view here, he does discuss (pp. 42-43) how, given the failure of the arguments he identifies, he thinks we should proceed. Readers familiar with Smith's recent turn to constitutivism will want to pay special attention to this essay.

Nick Zangwill (''Motivational Externalism: Formulation, Methodology, Rationality, and Indifference'') defends externalism. His argument is an inference to the best explanation. Some details: Zangwill begins by observing that we (and others) are often motivationally indifferent to what we sincerely believe to be morality's demands on us. According to Zangwill, an internalist explanation of this fact, in terms of a difference in rationality between those who are and those who are not motivated by their sincere moral beliefs, is inferior to an externalist explanations of the same, in terms of a difference in desire between those who are and those who are not motivated by their sincere moral beliefs. In particular, according to Zangwill, the internalist lacks a plausible sounding story to tell about mercenaries: ". . . some hopeful internalist could optimistically or sanguinely insist that mercenaries do really care, deep deep down, or really and truly they don't make moral judgments" (52, emphasis in original). Zangwill compares this strategy to a ''freshman psychological egoist's'' (52) insistence that, deep deep down, we are all selfish. The comparison is not meant to be flattering.

Jesse Prinz's contribution (''An Empirical Case for Motivational Internalism''), unsurprisingly for those familiar with Prinz's other work, makes a plea for understanding internalism as a psychological (rather than conceptual) thesis and offers an empirical argument for its truth. Prinz's plea is grounded in what he sees as the inadequacy of the intuition-based approach for settling the debate between internalists and externalists; his claim is not that the ''method of intuitions'' (65) is without any merit, only that it needs to be supplemented with empirical confirmation. And in Prinz's view, the empirical results confirm, or at least strongly suggest, internalism. In particular, Prinz thinks that since sentimentalist accounts of moral judgment (such as his own) enjoy strong empirical support, and since sentimentalist accounts of moral judgment seem to entail internalism, the empirical evidence that supports sentimentalist accounts of moral judgment lends its support to internalism. In addition to this argument from sentimentalism, Prinz points to several other sets of empirical evidence that might be used in arguing for the internalist conclusion. Philosophers being philosophers, Prinz's plea for empirical investigation may fall on deaf ears. But whatever one's general views about the relevance of empirical data to philosophical theorizing, the debate between externalists and internalists seems like an especially apt case for testing philosophical theories against real results, and Prinz's argument, if it works, shows that doing so favors internalism.

Daniel Eggers's essay (''Unconditional Motivational Internalism and Hume's Lesson'') attempts to simultaneously strengthen and weaken the typical internalist thesis. Against conditional internalism, which claims that agents are to some extent motivated by their moral judgments only given that certain conditions (such as virtuousness, or rationality, or psychological normality) hold, Eggers argues for unconditional internalism. That is how his essay strengthens the typical internalist thesis. The problem with this unconditional internalism is that it is ordinarily thought to be subject to a range of obvious counterexamples. But, Eggers argues, unconditional internalism isn't liable to these counterexamples once we recognize that being motivated ''to some extent'' is quite a weak requirement, and that the standard obvious counterexamples do not show that agents are not motivated at least ''to some extent''. That is how his essay weakens the typical internalist thesis. For, notice that both conditional and unconditional internalism share the idea that agents are motivated ''to some extent''. Eggers, like Prinz, is concerned with the empirical adequacy of his account. He both marshals existing empirical evidence in its support, and levies his own surveys the results of which, he argues, support unconditional internalism.

Jeanette Kennett's paper (''What's Required for Motivation by Principle?'') focuses on the question of how moral principles could motivate. Her claim, in brief, is that principles help unify agents' diachronically, and that possessing such principles requires agents being ''sensitive to projected or actual inconsistency between their principles and their plans, statements, and actions'' (127). Hence, diachronically unified agents are sensitive to a kind of cognitive dissonance, and it is this the lack of such sensitivity that explains our judgments in the case of psychopathic agents -- agents who do not seem to be motivated by their ''principles''. Kennett's explanation of the psychopath is therefore a competitor to Prinz's: while Prinz's sentimentalist account explains the psychopath's failure of motivation in terms of a failure or lack of empathy, Kennett's explains it in terms of a failure or lack of moral principles (and so a failure or lack of motivation by cognitive dissonance when their proposed actions are immoral). Kennett's essay, interesting in its own right, bears in an obvious but, it seems to me, only limited way on the debate between internalists and externalists. For, if we suppose that moral judgment is judgment somehow sourced in principles, then, given Kennett's account, it is a short step to an internalist result. But the claim that moral judgment is principle-based is controversial. For example, there are particularist accounts of moral judgment according to which ideal moral agents are fully sensitive to the relevant moral considerations without thereby deploying, accepting, or endorsing any moral principles. (See, for instance, Dancy 2004.) On this view, moral deliberation doesn't involve bringing principles to bear on the situation, and so, if this view is correct, Kennett's connection of the experience of cognitive dissonance, agents' use of principles, and internalism, is otiose. So, the application of Kennett's arguments to the debate between internalists and externalists depends on settling a somewhat different issue about the nature of practical (and in particular moral) thought.

Michael Ridge (''Internalism: Cui Bono?'') and Teemu Toppinen (''Pure Expressivism and Motivational Internalism'') each address the relevance of internalism to expressivist metaethics. According to Ridge, internalism militates in favor of hybrid expressivism (and, for that matter, hybrid cognitivism); Toppinen thinks that only ''first-order'' expressivist views, i.e., views that hold that normative judgments concerning some content are at least in part desire-like attitudes toward that very content (as opposed to being desire-like attitudes toward some other content involving the first content) can accept internalism. So, both of these papers, in different ways, argue that the range of acceptable expressivist accounts of normative judgment is restricted by whether one is or is not an internalist about motivation. Given that expressivists almost always appeal to their view's ability to account for internalism in touting the advantages of the view over its non-expressivist competitors, these papers are important reads for anyone interested in expressivism's prospects.

In his contribution (''Can Reasons Fundamentalism Answer the Normative Question?'') Jamie Dreier puts a hard question to realists about normativity: What explains why it is irrational to be motivated by one's normative judgments? This question, when actually put to actual realists, tends to receive a blank stare or, in the case of Parfit, a ''that is not so'' (169). Dreier's essay is devoted, in the main, to arguing that this question deserves more than blank stares, and that those who have asked it have done themselves several different disservices in their formulation of it. Properly posed, he thinks, it represents a real challenge to realist accounts of normativity.

Jon Tresan's essay (''Naturalistic Moral Realism and Motivational Internalism: From Negative to Positive'') shows how naturalistic realism's reconciliation with motivational internalism via direct functionalism also enables a reconciliation, also by way of direct functionalism, of naturalistic realism with the view that there is no objectively real natural property such that, necessarily, judgments that x-ing is morally wrong ascribe that property to x-ing (183). As this description suggests, Tresan's paper is deep in the metaethical trenches. For those already dug in, the paper offers a novel (and revisionary) take on what naturalistic moral realism's commitments might be. For those who are not, fully appreciating Tresan's work in the paper requires background (which Tresan points to, in the course of his arguments).

Sigrún Svavarsdóttir (''Detecting Value with Motivational Responses'') is an externalist, but she hopes to explain our (internalist seeming) expectation that people will be motivated by their moral judgments. According to Svavarsdóttir, the explanation goes by way of the ''canonical'' method for determining whether something has (pro tanto intrinsic) value, which is to assess whether one does in fact value it (for its own sake). Because this activity of valuing (as distinct from the activity of judging that something is valuable) typically involves connative attitudes with motivational effect, we typically expect motivation to follow. So, Svavarsdóttir thinks, we can keep the wolf full and the lamb whole. Svavarsdóttir's discussion is rich and full of insight into how we typically experience value. I think only the most hardcore rationalists would claim that the method Svavarsdóttir identifies is not a method for identifying value. But her argument turns on whether it is the ''canonical'' method, i.e., whether it is the method we "folk" (228) do in fact use. As Svavarsdóttir points out, she lacks the space in this essay to defend the idea that the method she identifies is canonical. She faces two challenges on this front: she must not only show that the method she identifies is one we folk use (that is a challenge I think she can meet), she must also show that it is the method we folk use to the exclusion of other methods (that is a challenge I am less sure she can meet). That is, she doesn't just need to show that it's canonical, she needs to show that the canon comprises one method. But why think there is a single canonical method for identifying value, rather than a cluster of methods? I'm not entirely sure Svavarsdóttir is sensitive to her need to show this; for instance, she says the ''most important'' question is the question of whether it is ''plausible that we rely on motivational responses for assuring us that something is of pro tanto intrinsic value'' (233). That is one important question -- answering it affirmatively accomplishes one half of what she would need to accomplish. But answering that question doesn't settle the question of whether there are other, also canonical, possibly not motivational entailing, methods for identifying value. Or so it seems to me.

Antti Kauppinen (''Intuition and Belief in Moral Motivation'') argues in the antepenultimate essay of the volume for what is ordinarily thought of as the last resort: disjunctivism. According to Kauppinen, internalism is true about our moral intuitions, whereas externalism is true about our moral beliefs. His support for the first disjunct is a view about moral intuitions according to which they are quasi-perceptual non-doxastic presentations with distinctive phenomenological (and in particular motivational) content. Thus, our moral intuitions (such as Huck Finn's intuition that turning in Jim would be wrong) ordinarily move us to act (242). Moral beliefs, by contrast, bear only a contingent, though non-accidental, relationship to motivation. Hence, externalism about moral belief. For anyone pre-theoretically sympathetic to a pluralist view of matters, Kauppinen's essay will be welcome.

Kate Manne (''Tempered Internalism and the Participatory Stance'') offers a version of conditional internalism according to which ''a moral judgment made by an agent about what she herself (currently) ought to do will entail motivation on her part to act in accordance with this judgment, provided that she takes the practical stance toward herself which is fitting for such judgments'' (263, emphasis in original). Now, tampering with internalism in order to temper it isn't new (see the discussion of Eggers's essay, above), but Manne's modifications are novel. Drawing on Strawson's (1962) claims about the participatory stance, Manne's view is that an agent's failure to be motivated by her moral judgments is a failure in the agent herself: it is a failure to be or to see herself as being an active participant in the practice of making moral judgment.

John Mumm's paper (''Two Functions of Moral Language: Rethinking the Amoralist'') offers a conciliationist account. Mumm argues that the prima facie puzzling nature of a moral judgment that fail to motivate results from the fact that such judgments fail to fulfill the social function of moral judgments, which is ''co-deliberative'' (292). Roughly, the co-deliberative function of moral judgments is a matter of their serving to coordinate our thoughts, feelings, and actions around certain sorts of behavior by expressing reactive attitudes such as blame, resentment, guilt, disapproval, and so on (291). According to Mumm, then, moral judgments that systematically fail to yield motivation because they do not express such attitudes (such as judgments by amoralists, say) fail to fulfill the function of such judgments but are nonetheless real moral judgments, only a second-class, derivative sort. So, as I said, Mumm's paper is conciliationist: with the externalist, he agrees that amoralists make genuine moral judgments; and with the internalist, he agrees that there is something deeply defective about such judgments (they fail, as he puts it, to play the role they are ''for'' (295).)

So: Who should buy (and then presumably read) this collection? The volume covers a wide array of issues surrounding the motivational internalism debate, from a diverse set of perspectives, with a high degree of philosophical clarity and originality on display. As such, it will be interesting to those already engaged in, or making plans to wade into, that debate. The volume would also be suitable as a text for a graduate seminar focused on motivational internalism. The editors' lengthy introductory chapter and shorter introductions to the three sections do an admirable job of introducing less well-traveled readers to unfamiliar terrain.

Björnsson, G., et. al, eds. 2015. Motivational Internalism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Dancy, J. 2004. Ethics without Principles, Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Strawson, P. F. 1962. "Freedom and Resentment", Proceedings of the British Academy, 48: 1-25.

Thomson, J. 2008. Normativity. The Paul Carus Lectures. Open Court.