Motive and Rightness

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Steven Sverdlik, Motive and Rightness, Oxford University Press, 2011, 203pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199594948.

Reviewed by Garrett Pendergraft, Pepperdine University


Steven Sverdlik's Motive and Rightness is an impressive and wide-ranging treatment of an important but relatively under-explored question: Can the motive of an action affect its deontic status? (That is to say, does an action's motive ever determine whether that action is right or wrong?) According to Sverdlik, the answer is yes: Motives matter.

Motives Matter (MM): There is an action X such that if X were performed from one motive it would fall into one deontic category and if X were performed from another motive it would fall into a second deontic category in virtue of this difference in motives. (4)

In addition to defending the claim that motives matter, Sverdlik is also interested in figuring out which substantive moral theory can provide the most plausible explanation of the deontic relevance of motives. His conclusion is that extrinsic consequentialism (about which more below) does the best job of providing the desired explanation. Consideration of this explanatory question makes up the bulk of the book (Chs. 3-7), with the first two chapters introducing terms and examples, and the last two chapters answering additional questions that arise along the way.

So. Do motives matter? Thinkers as diverse as Aristotle, Kant, and Mill have given (or implied) negative answers, but typically without providing much of an argument (Chapter 1). And it does seem that an argument is needed, since almost everyone will grant that there are plenty of moral judgments (e.g., judgments about a person's character) that can be affected by motives. So why not moral judgments about an action's deontic status? Moreover, there are some motives -- including malice, racism, and the desire for money -- that do seem capable of making a difference to the deontic status of actions. For example (55-58), it seems that a racist motive might make refusing to shake someone's hand wrong when otherwise it wouldn't be. (We don't, however, want to say that motives always [or even typically] matter, because we want our conceptions of obligation, permissibility, and wrongness to be mostly objective.)

Before going any farther, it's worth asking (Chapter 2) what exactly a motive is. Sverdlik defines it as follows (18):

The motive of an action is the ultimate desire of the agent that explains its occurrence, or some feature of it.

In order to understand what an ultimate desire is, consider my belief that it would be desirable to be more alert this afternoon, and my belief that drinking coffee would make me more alert. The first belief, because it represents acceptance of a normative proposition, is a normative belief -- which I can (and often do) employ in a practical syllogism that culminates with my drinking coffee. And the structure of my desires will correspond to the structure of my normative beliefs: if, for example, I believe that it would be desirable to be more alert, then I will want to be more alert. My ultimate desire, then, will be the desire that corresponds to the major premise in my practical syllogism. This is my motive for drinking coffee.

We now have a characterization of the concept of a motive, as well as an example in which it seems that a motive is deontically relevant. Assuming that this characterization and this example are plausible, we can ask whether there are any substantive moral theories that have the resources to explain the deontic relevance of motives (while maintaining a largely objective conception of deontic status).

According to Sverdlik, extrinsic consequentialism (Chapter 3) is the moral theory that has the desired resources -- which might seem surprising, given J. S. Mill's explicit disavowal of their deontic relevance (48). Mill doesn't really provide an argument for rejecting MM, but the most obvious argument (Sverdlik calls it the "quasi-Millian argument") would appeal to the forward-looking nature of consequentialism: motives can't matter because only consequences matter, and motives are not consequences. This argument fails for two reasons. First, it's false that only consequences matter, because the action itself (or its properties) could have intrinsic value (which could be affected -- directly or indirectly -- by motives). Second, an action might produce different consequences, depending on the motive from which it's performed. (For example [52], the effects of killing out of revenge will generally differ from the effects of killing out of greed.)

If some motive can affect the intrinsic value of an action, or the intrinsic value of its consequences (in virtue of affecting how the action is done, or how people respond to the action), then that motive has extrinsic value. And that extrinsic value is what gives the motive deontic relevance. (55) Do motives also have intrinsic value? Extrinsic consequentialists say no, while proponents of intrinsic consequentialism say yes. Sverdlik considers Hurka's version of intrinsic consequentialism (Chapter 4), according to which, for example, the motive of producing new knowledge as an end has intrinsic value. But the problem with this claim is that desires are attitudes whose function is to change the world in some way -- which suggests that the intrinsic value inheres in the desired states of the world rather than the desires themselves. So it seems that even the desire to produce new knowledge as an end has extrinsic but not intrinsic value.

The consequentialist thus seems capable of explaining the plausibility of some examples that support the claim that motives matter. What about the Kantian? This is a daunting question, but Sverdlik does an admirable job of narrowing the focus so that the task of answering it becomes more manageable (while addressing some of the more contentious issues in footnotes). He asks first (Chapter 5) whether the universal law formulation of the categorical imperative renders the correct deontic verdict in the case of refusing to shake someone's hand out of a racist motive, and whether it preserves a largely objective conception of deontic status. He then asks (Chapter 6) the same two questions with respect to the formula of humanity. In short, the results are that both formulations go wrong, but in interestingly different ways. The universal law formulation renders an incorrect deontic verdict with respect to the example in question, whereas the formula of humanity is incapable of preserving an objective conception of deontic status.

Sverdlik runs roughly the same line of argument against two representative versions of virtue ethics (Chapter 7). The neo-Aristotelian theory (Hursthouse's) appears to entail that motives do not matter, whereas the non-Aristotelian theory (Slote's) allows that motives matter but also appears to be inconsistent with a largely objective conception of deontic status. So it seems that (extrinsic) consequentialism is the only moral framework that harmonizes with the intuitive judgment that motives matter while preserving a largely objective conception of deontic status.

In Chapter 8, Sverdlik engages in a fascinating and illuminating discussion of the availability of motives. He ultimately distinguishes between four types of availability: epistemic, affirmative, operative, and affective. The (perhaps surprising) upshot of the discussion is that if two motives are both epistemically and operatively available to an agent (which is to say that the agent is both aware of the relevant desires and able to make them guide her action) -- and if the action's deontic status would differ, depending on which motive the agent affirms in acting -- then it's possible that the agent could act wrongly if she performs the action from one motive but permissibly if she performs it from another motive.

Thus far we have only considered wrong-making motives. But if motives are relevant to wrongness then they might be relevant to obligations as well. (In other words, an action that is merely permissible from one motive might be obligatory if done from a different motive.) As it turns out (Chapter 9), for reasons having to do with the limited availability of certain motives, the claim that motives matter to obligation is harder to defend than the corresponding claim about wrongness. Sverdlik takes on this challenge by appealing to the resources of extrinsic consequentialism to show that there is nothing problematic about an obligation to act from a motive (if we have it). Here is an example (183) of a case in which a motive apparently renders an action obligatory:

S is aware that if she were to take a walk with T in a little while she would be doing so only from friendliness, and that T would appreciate this. S could therefore see that her motivation would make doing this especially gratifying to T.

To sum up Sverdlik's conclusions: motives do matter, and extrinsic consequentialism is the moral theory that is best able to explain this judgment while maintaining a largely objective conception of deontic status.

This book is clear, thorough, and consistently interesting; and I am inclined to agree with Sverdlik that motives matter. I do, however, have a few critical comments, which I will limit to one complaint about the overall methodology and a few objections to extrinsic consequentialism.

My general complaint has to do with the nature of Sverdlik's overall approach. His basic argumentative strategy consists of presenting (and providing some theoretical underpinnings for) some examples about which it is intuitively plausible to say that the motive in question is deontically relevant, and then rebutting the arguments that motives don't matter to obligation. Although I see no reason to deny that motives matter, I can imagine someone who does see such a reason finding this strategy to be overly indirect. Sverdlik certainly stakes out the territory in a compelling way, but I might prefer to see a little more in terms of a direct defense of the thesis that motives matter.

I also have my doubts about the alleged advantages of extrinsic consequentialism. Sverdlik's view is that motives matter to both obligation and prohibition, which is to say that they can be both wrong-making and obligation-making. But someone might entertain the view that whereas motives matter to wrongness, they never matter to obligation; there are wrong-making motives, but there are no obligation-making motives. Sverdlik rejects this view, because "the reasoning whereby consequentialism supports MM is symmetrical: if some motives are extrinsically bad, and can make an otherwise permissible action wrong, then other motives are extrinsically good" (175). I'm not convinced that the existence of extrinsically good motives follows from the existence of extrinsically bad motives, in part because I am not at all taken with his examples of obligation-making motives (the most prominent of which is cited above).

It seems to me that whereas the wrongness of refusing to shake someone's hand from racism may very well be grounded in the motive of that action, S's obligation to walk with T from friendliness is instead somehow grounded in the relationship between S and T. I'm not sure that I can provide a general argument for this asymmetry between prohibition and obligation, but consider the following variations on the examples. Suppose that Q refuses to shake R's hand from a racist motive; now suppose that Q is mistaken about R's race. In this case it seems to me that Q's refusal is still wrong (in virtue of the racist motive). But if we change the facts of the matter in S's case, such that S is mistaken about the nature of her relationship with T, then it seems that her obligation to take a walk with T goes away -- even if S's motive remains the same, and even if T would still appreciate the gesture. This difference between the two examples at least suggests that motives might matter to wrongness but not to obligation.

But even if we accept the claim that motives matter to both prohibition and obligation, there are other reasons to doubt the ultimate viability of extrinsic consequentialism. These are problems that Sverdlik raises but doesn't really address, so these last two critical comments can be viewed as requests for further clarification and defense.

One of the examples that Sverdlik presents involves prostitution (14). His claim is that the desire for money might make an otherwise permissible action (i.e., consensual sex) wrong. Whereas other examples include motives (such as racism and malice) that seem to have some sort of disvalue, the desire for money seems to be neutral. So if there is something wrong with having sex out of a desire for money, then a neutral motive and a neutral action have somehow combined to produce a wrong action. This seems like "moral alchemy" (60, citing Hart). Sverdlik acknowledges that the consequentialist will need to provide a separate treatment of prostitution, but never gestures toward what that treatment might look like. The most obvious move is to claim that the desire for money does after all have some intrinsic disvalue, which is perhaps amplified when coupled with certain actions -- but of course this move isn't available to the extrinsic consequentialist.

Finally, notice that the extrinsic consequentialist cannot say that a perfectly concealed motive (i.e., a motive that makes no difference to how an action is performed or perceived) is deontically relevant. This is not a serious problem, since the number of cases in which a motive is perfectly concealed will be small, but it does seem odd to say that a racist motive can make an action wrong, but won't as long as the motive is perfectly concealed. So this, as Sverdlik acknowledges (75), is another drawback of extrinsic consequentialism.

Even with those complaints in mind, Motive and Rightness remains well worth a careful read -- especially for those whose interests lie in moral theory, moral psychology, or action theory.