Movements of the Mind: A Theory of Attention, Intention and Action

Movements of the Mind

Wayne Wu, Movements of the Mind: A Theory of Attention, Intention and Action, Oxford University Press, 2023, 257pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192866899.

Reviewed by Henry Taylor, University of Birmingham


This book puts forward a theory of action. It synthesises Wayne Wu’s extensive work on action and attention going back over a decade, and also substantially extends this foundation. Wu’s approach involves linking the theory of action to empirical work on working memory and attention. He also applies the resultant picture of action to a variety of philosophical issues.

The result is excellent. The book is wide-ranging, systematic, very original, and crammed full of interesting ideas. It draws together scientific work with philosophical argumentation in a way that is both rigorous and unusually readable. I have no doubt that it will be important to thinkers interested in action and attention, as well as philosophers of cognitive science more generally.

In presenting a framework for thinking about action and attention, the book necessarily covers a lot of terrain. Navigation of the book is greatly helped by a summary of its main claims toward the start (14–16). Here I give a selective survey of Wu’s view, then raise three queries about it.

Part one of the book (chapters 1–2) sets out Wu’s overall picture. For Wu, action is most helpfully understood in terms of the ‘selection problem’. This issue is faced by agents who have many potential inputs that could inform their actions, and many potential outputs. Here the ‘outputs’ (which Wu calls ‘responses’) may involve physical behaviour, or they may not. The challenge, for us as agents, is to link up (or ‘couple’) the appropriate input with the appropriate response. For example, suppose that there is a cup of coffee on the desk in front of you. Visual information about the cup of coffee is one input, and there are many responses that you might have as a result of the information. You might pick the cup up, throw it across the room, etc. According to Wu, action involves coupling an input to the appropriate response. You couple the input of the visual information about the coffee cup to the response pick up the cup and drink from it. The space of potential inputs, potential responses, and possible couplings between them are what Wu calls a ‘behaviour space’. For Wu, then, action becomes a matter of charting a path through a behaviour space, from an input to a response. In the example I just gave, there is only one input (the visual information about the coffee cup). The behaviour space will become more complex the more inputs and potential responses there are. For example, if there is a cup of coffee, a book and a set of keys on my desk, then action might take the form of coupling one of the inputs (e.g., cup of coffee) to a response (e.g., pick up the cup and drink from it). In previous work, Wu has referred to this kind of behaviour space as presenting a ‘many-many problem’ (2011). There are many inputs, and many potential responses, and action involves selecting the correct path through this confusion.

The coupling between input and response is influenced by the agent’s biases. Biases help to solve the selection problem, by helping to chart a path between input and response. According to Wu, an agent’s intentions are a form of bias, but there are others, which need not fit with the subject’s intentions. Emotions are a kind of bias that sometimes work against a subject’s intentions. For example, suppose a subject is angry at someone, but knows that their anger is unjustified, and so resolves to be nice to the person. Suppose the subject lashes out when the person makes an innocent comment (33). Here the emotion makes a coupling between an input (the comment) and a response (the lashing out), but not one that accords with the subject’s intentions. Wu claims that all action involves biases, and also that all action involves a certain amount of automaticity.

Attention is centre-stage in this theory of action. Wu relies on a taxonomy of attention that chops it up into three kinds: vigilance (the disposition to attend to a certain stimulus when it arises), attending (the action of paying attention to something) and attention-in-action (attention’s role in guiding action). This latter idea deserves more explanation. Solving the selection problem involves taking an input and using it to inform (or guide) a response. For Wu, this kind of guidance from input to response is attention (63).

For thinkers interested in the neuroscience of attention, Wu (somewhat briefly) links his picture to the celebrated ‘biased competition’ model of attention. According to this view, attention is the result of different neural mechanisms ‘competing’ with each other so that their information can be processed further. Given limited processing capacity in the brain, the bias part comes in when one neural mechanism is selected for further processing because its information is task-relevant (Desimone and Duncan 1995).

In part two (chapters 3–4), Wu links his theory of action to empirical models of working memory (e.g., Baddeley and Logie 1999). Of course, the literature on working memory is vast, but the most important ideas are as follows. It is a multi-component, short-term, limited capacity memory system, which stores and manipulates information in a variety of formats. The currently dominant model of working memory includes subcomponents for linguistic and visual information, known as the phonological loop and the visuo-spatial sketchpad respectively (Baddeley 2003). Working memory interfaces with various other faculties of the mind, such as long-term memory and language systems. Another of the subcomponents of working memory is the central executive. The central executive is in charge of controlling the distribution of attention in order to ensure that it is directed to the appropriate stimuli to fulfil the task that the agent is undertaking.

Here is one of Wu’s most important claims: the central executive, which features in theories of working memory, is an empirical explication of the notion of intention (104–110). Wu’s idea is as follows. My intentions (to drink a cup of coffee, to go for a walk, etc.) are ultimately to be explained in terms of the central executive system in working memory. My intention (to drink some coffee) is a bias that directs my attention to take particular stimuli (the cup of coffee on my desk) to guide a particular response (my drinking of the coffee). The psychological explication of this notion of intention (claims Wu) is to be found in working memory’s central executive, since this faculty is what controls the allocation of attention to task-relevant stimuli. Wu then uses this picture to explain the role of intention in on-going action. Along the way he touches on Elizabeth Anscombe’s question of how we have knowledge of our own intentions.

Part three of the book applies this picture to three wider issues. Wu discusses ethical questions arising from attentional bias, and how this links to expert and amateur attentional behaviour (chapter 5); the nature of deduction and reasoning (chapter 6), and the reliability of introspection (chapter 7).

I hope it is obvious even from this brief summary just how rich and thought provoking the book is. Here I just raise three queries to Wu’s picture. The first is methodological, and concerns the role of folk psychology. Occasionally, Wu expresses scepticism at the use of folk psychology in settling issues connected to the philosophy of action, and suggests that empirical psychology might be a better thing to rely on (e.g., 2–3, 8, 81, 88, 123). However, at times, Wu relies on what appear to be folk psychological intuitions to motivate his picture. At one point, he uses a thought experiment involving putting a pot of soup on to boil, and then getting distracted by emails, with the result that the soup burns (125–7 and 147–9). He uses this to draw conclusions about the intelligibility of our own agency. This certainly looks like reaching substantial conclusions about agency from folk psychological intuition. After all, if this kind of thought experiment is not relying on folk psychological intuition, then what is it relying on? This is not an objection to the methodology, but it does indicate that Wu’s picture may be more reliant on folk psychology than is initially apparent.

The second and third queries concern the idea that the central executive subcomponent of working memory provides an empirical explication of the philosophical notion of intention. Here I will raise an issue for this claim, based on long-standing intentions. By ‘long-standing intentions’, I just mean any intentions that last a few hours or more. For example, I might intend to go climbing this afternoon, or to go shopping tomorrow. These intentions might last a day or so. I might also have some very long-standing intentions. I might intend to read some Victorian novels next year, or try to maintain a better work-life balance in future years. Presumably, we all have many long-standing intentions. The issue is as follows. If our intentions are to be explicated in terms of the central executive system, which is a subcomponent of working memory, then where are these long-standing intentions stored? Where are they ‘kept’ over the hours, or even years, at which we have them? The core problem is that the central executive system is in charge of allocating attentional resources for our current tasks. So, where do long-standing intentions fit into the picture, given that they can fade into the background, and not be relevant to our current tasks?

Wu has a variety of responses available, but all come with drawbacks. I will consider three. One obvious response is to claim that long-standing intentions are stored in working memory itself. However, this would contradict the widely accepted claim that working memory has a very limited storage capacity. Wu himself mentions the common idea that working memory has a capacity of three or four ‘chunks’ (98). Indeed, even thinkers who reject the idea that working memory capacity should be measured in ‘chunks’ (Ma et al. 2014) would agree that its capacity is still far too low to include all of our long-standing intentions.

Another response on behalf of Wu would be to claim that the long-standing intentions are not stored in working memory, but rather that central executive system itself stores these long-standing intentions, and then uses them to guide attention when they become relevant. On this view, the central executive itself can store representations (long-standing intentions) for hours or years, until they become relevant for the direction of attention. Indeed, at one point, Wu suggests that the central executive system itself can store representations that it uses to execute its plans (102). But this would be a clear deviation from the empirical literature on working memory. To make it work, we would have to postulate another memory store, ‘belonging to’ or ‘inside’ the central executive. This memory store would be high-capacity (much higher capacity than working memory itself) and would store all of our long-standing intentions, such as my intention to go climbing this afternoon, or to read more novels. This is not an idea I am aware of in the empirical literature.

Another possible response, of course, is to claim that our long-standing intentions are not stored in working memory, or in the central executive itself, but in one of the long-term memory systems that working memory interfaces with. Everyone accepts that working memory interfaces with long-term memory (e.g., Baddeley 2003, 834) so this response would be completely plausible. However, it would be to give up on the central idea that intention can be explicated in terms of the central executive. On this view, intentions would be encoded in long-term memory, not in the central executive, or in working memory.

My final query to Wu’s picture concerns the explanatory power of the central executive. Understanding intention in terms of the central executive can only be explanatory insofar as we have a grip on what the central executive is. It’s easy to get a metaphorical grasp on the central executive. It’s the boss of working memory: assigning attentional resources to the most relevant tasks. But what kind of grasp on the central executive do we have, beyond the metaphor? Wu is aware of this problem, commenting that some psychologists have expressed scepticism about the concept of a ‘central executive’. The essence of the worry is as follows. Postulating an ‘executive’ in charge of guiding attention in working memory to task-relevant stimuli can feel a bit too much like the postulation of a homunculus (102). At the very least, it should be admitted that, in Alan Baddeley’s words, ‘The central executive is the most important but least understood component of working memory’ (2003, 834). If we take seriously the complaint that the notion of a ‘central executive’ is hard to get a non-metaphorical grasp on, we might worry about how much light it can shed on intention, action, and attention.

Of course, this is not the end of the story. Wu has resources to respond to this query. At one point, Wu hints at the idea that the ‘central executive’ might be defined entirely in terms of a narrow set of psychological tasks that it helps the subject fulfil (102). Perhaps this is all the characterisation of the central executive we need. In any case, even if the central executive is left at the intuitive/metaphorical level, this does not imply that Wu’s view is trivial, or that it lacks explanatory force. On the contrary, even in such a case, the theory would still be very exciting, since it directly links intention (a faculty that is familiar from folk psychology, and has been much studied by philosophy), to the central executive (a faculty in perceptual and cognitive psychology, which is clearly suitable to empirical investigation).

None of these queries should detract from what an excellent book this is. It moves several debates forward in new and interesting directions, and provides a productive point of intersection between the philosophy of action, interdisciplinary work on attention, and perceptual psychology.


Baddeley, A. 2003. Working memory: looking forward and looking back. Nature Reviews. 4: 829–839.

Baddeley, A. and Logie, R. 1999. Working memory: the multiple-component model. In Models of Working Memory. Ed. A. Miyake and P. Shah. New York: CUP.

Desimone, R. and Duncan, J. 1995. Neural mechanisms of selective visual attention. Annual Review of Neuroscience. 18: 193–222.

Ma, J., Husain, M. and Bays, P. 2014. Changing concepts of working memory. Nature Neuroscience. 17: 347–356.

Wu, W. 2011. Confronting many-many problems: attention and agentive control. Noûs. 45: 50–76