Multiculturalism: A Critical Introduction

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Michael Murphy, Multiculturalism: A Critical Introduction, Routledge, 2012, 196pp., $35.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415260435.

Reviewed by Brady Heiner, California State University, Fullerton


Michael Murphy takes on the challenge of providing a concise critical introduction to multiculturalism -- a subject whose terrain and terminologies remain analytically confused, culturally entangled, and deeply contested (Hall, Ponzanesi). Indeed, the proliferation of diverse and contradictory uses of the concept in academic, policy, and mass media discourses, especially since 9/11, confirm what postcolonial, literary, and critical race theorists have argued about "multiculturalism" for fifteen years: that it has become a "conceptual grab bag" with "elastic boundaries" and "a corresponding dilution of content" (Mills 2007, p. 89), a "floating" or "empty signifier" onto which "a range of groups project their fears and hopes" (Bhabha, p. 31; Gunew, p. 19), "an incoherent concept, which cannot be meaningfully either affirmed or rejected" (Fish, p. 78; quoted in Murphy, p. 12).

"Multiculturalism" refers to anything from the cultural and political discourses and practices of foreign nationals and immigrants, to those of racial, ethnic, sexual, religious, and subnational minorities; from the social characteristics and problems of governance posed by any society composed of different cultural communities, to issues of tertiary education and curriculum reform; from the strategies and policies adopted to govern or manage the problems of diversity and multiplicity that multicultural societies engender, to the normative justifications of those strategies and policies (Bhabha, Hall, Sharma). Not only do the descriptive, normative, and legal senses of multiculturalism frequently get conflated -- a problem that leads Murphy to spend nearly a quarter of the book engaging in what he calls "philosophical brush-clearing" (p. 28). It's also the case that the literature on multiculturalism is vast, multidisciplinary, theoretically fragmented, and (as one might expect) developed and focused in disparate ways in different countries.

To "bring a sense of clarity and coherence" to this complexly contested field of discourse, Murphy "follow[s] the methodology of Wittgenstein, by seeking to understand how the term 'multiculturalism' has been used in actual philosophical debates," and he adopts two "organizational strategies" to make this task "more manageable" (pp. 6, 13, 62). First, he organizes the discussion around different types of arguments that recur in the literature, rather than focusing on the theoretical trajectories of particular philosophers. Second, he focuses mainly on the ideas of "some of the more influential multiculturalists [and critics], whose work is broadly representative of the diversity of perspectives and approaches in the field," trying, in good multicultural fashion, "to be as inclusive as possible" (p. 62).

Regrettably, the book is not nearly as broadly representative of the diversity of perspectives and approaches in the field as it purports (and ought) to be, especially given its representative pedagogical aims. Murphy docks multiculturalism on a rather exclusive island of Anglo-American political philosophy. The book is thus not, as it claims and as one might infer from the title, a critical introduction to multicultural political philosophy. Nor does it reflect the kind of methodological pluralism and cross-disciplinarity that the subject demands.

A more apt, though admittedly less marketable, title for the volume would be An Introduction to Anglo-American Liberal Political Philosophy of Multiculturalism. For, with the exception of passing reference to Seyla Benhabib and engagement with the works of Iris Young, the book almost entirely ignores relevant literatures from critical theory, continental philosophy, and pragmatism (e.g., Balibar, Brown 1995, 2006, Butler 1998, Fraser and Honneth, Goldberg, Willett, Žižek). It also disregards or marginalizes foundational critical perspectives from area studies and intersectional analyses from postcolonial theory, critical race theory, queer theory, and feminist philosophy that exceed the framework of liberalism (e.g., Blasius, Blum, Chakrabarty, Crenshaw, Davis, Ford, Gooding-Williams, Guha, Gunew, Hancock, Mills 2007, Mohanty, Morris, Narayan and Harding, Ortega and Alcoff,Pateman, Pateman and Mills, Takaki, Vasta and Castles, Williams).[1] Furthermore, it overlooks notable political philosophers of color working from within the liberal tradition on issues of race and reparative or corrective justice (e.g., Boxill 1972, 1984, 2003; Corlett 2003, 2010; McGary; Roberts) -- a germane aspect of the debate about "multicultural accommodation," which runs through Murphy's text, that is hastily dismissed (esp. pp. 103-11, 118-27).

Strategic selection and omission are, of course, the stock-in-trade of single-authored introductory textbooks of this kind. However, the text's organizational and methodological framework and the way it defines, delineates, and situates the field -- in addition to the omissions just mentioned -- are philosophically problematic, in my view, and they lessen the text's value as a pedagogical resource. I'll substantiate this criticism in the degree of depth that this forum permits. But first, I'll lay out the structure of the book and point to some of its notable strengths.

Strengths and Structural Overview

Murphys' Multiculturalism begins with three introductory chapters. The first chapter is schematic. It enumerates the three core issues of multiculturalist political philosophy around which later chapters are organized (i.e., equal consideration and justice, the limits of multicultural accommodation, and cultivating social cohesion in diversity). It sketches four impediments to clear debate on the pitfalls and benefits of multiculturalism (including the failure to acknowledge perspectival diversity within the political philosophy of multiculturalism, and the failure to distinguish multiculturalism as a political philosophy from the multicultural policies adopted by particular states and institutions). And it concludes with a one-page outline of the book.

The second chapter aims to succinctly lay to rest three alleged misconceptions about the relation between multiculturalism and cultural difference that are held to "impede productive debate" (p. 28): (1) the cultural essentialism misconception, which is the notion that multiculturalism is tethered to an untenable and potentially harmful doctrine of cultural essentialism; (2) the radical moral relativism misconception, which holds that multiculturalism is a recipe for radical moral relativism; and (3) the politics of distraction misconception, the charge, advanced principally by theorists engaged in struggles against racial and economic injustice, that multiculturalism necessarily entails a myopic focus on objective cultural differences (i.e., beliefs, practices, traditions, languages, lifestyles) to the exclusion of racial, gender, and sexual domination, and socioeconomic injustice.

Murphy adeptly disarms (1). Reconstructing Jeremy Waldron's cosmopolitan argument about the intrinsic cross-fertilization, intermixing, and temporal instability of culture, Murphy drives home the point -- originally made by poststructuralist and postcolonialist theories (from which the logic of Waldron's argument derives,[2] but which are absent from Murphy's text) -- that cultural identity is, in Rey Chow's words, "always already mediated by the slow but indismissible labor of temporality." Or, as Judith Butler phrased it vis-à-vis gender, "identity is a stylized repetition of acts through time, and not a seemingly seamless identity." To demand that subjects or cultural communities manifest and maintain self-identity at all times is to participate in ethical or political violence (Chow, p. 176; Butler 1990, p. 192; 2005, p. 42; Anzaldúa; Blasius; Collins; Hall 1990; Lugones).

Murphy also dispenses with (2). He distinguishes between moral anti-foundationalism and radical moral relativism, and persuasively argues that the former position, which most multiculturalists adopt, does not necessarily entail the latter, which most multiculturalists reject. With respect to the politics of distraction charge, however, Murphy's Multiculturalismremains fraught. While Murphy is right to argue that multicultural political philosophy does not necessarily involve an evasion or obfuscation of racial, gender, and sexual domination -- and critical multiculturalisms certainly do not -- the introduction to this Critical Introduction explicitly excludes these categories of analysis from the scope of the book. Designating such analytic categories as "specialized themes," Murphy maintains that to substantively include them in a critical introduction "would either require a much longer book or a thinning of the existing analysis to the point where it would no longer serve anyone's purposes" (pp. 5, 7). Thus, Murphy's text itself performs the very exclusions and "theoretical vanishing-act[s]" on account of which critical race theorists decry the conventional categories of multiculturalism (Mills 2007, p. 104; Blum; Ford, p. 45). The problems that this evasion generates will be the subject of my concluding critique.

Chapter three provides a welcome typology of common multicultural policies, offering seven categories: voice, symbolic recognition, redistribution, protection, exemptions, assistance, and autonomy. Discussion of each category provides a general description and series of concrete policy examples, the purposes they are intended to serve, the types of justification to which they are subject, and the types of groups to which they are addressed. The close connection constructed throughout the book between philosophical principles and arguments, on the one hand, and comparative governmental policies, on the other, is among its greatest strengths, as it regularly invites readers to explore the political and legal implications of the theories under consideration. Foregrounding the common range of policies adopted by various governments in response to diversity within their borders prioritizes this bridgework between theory and policy. Absent from this bridgework, however, are rich connections to political practices, especially minority social justice activism and social movements beyond the horizon of the state.

Chapter four, a transitional chapter, traces the intellectual origins of multiculturalist political philosophy to the breakdown of the liberal-communitarian debate that had dominated Anglo-American liberal political philosophy in the 1970s and 1980s. Since the genealogy that this chapter provides is symptomatic of what I take to be the book's underlying inadequacy, I will save further comment on it for my concluding critical remarks.

The heart of the book, chapters five through eight, focuses on what the text refers to as "the philosophical champions of multiculturalism," a circle centered around Will Kymlicka,Chandran Kukathas, Bhikhu Parekh, and Charles Taylor, and some of their critics (Brian Barry and Susan Okin most prominently, but also James Tully and Iris Young, among others). The champions first defend multiculturalism, in chapter five, via what Murphy categorizes into seven types of argument: liberal culturalism, tolerationist multiculturalism, the value of cultural diversity, the politics of inclusion, deliberative multiculturalism, democratic multinationalism, and the politics of recognition. Then the champions meet critics in debates organized around the three core issues enumerated early on in the book: equal consideration and justice (chapter six), the limits of multicultural accommodation (chapter seven), and cultivating social cohesion in diversity (chapter eight).

These chapters, like most of the book, are exceptionally clear in their organization. Arguments are coherently rendered and classified, policy examples are readily and demonstratively referenced, and the prose succeeds in constructing a very coherent, pleasurable -- what Roland Barthes might have called a "readerly" -- narrative replete with expert summary conclusions in each chapter.

Chapter nine ends the book with a welcome introduction to methodological contextualism, exemplified by Joseph Carens' Culture, Citizenship, and Community: A Contextual Exploration of Justice as Evenhandedness (2000). Organized around two case studies (language laws in Quebec, and the controversy surrounding the representation of the Prophet Muhammad in a series of Danish political cartoons in 2005), the chapter aims to articulate and illustrate the benefits of grounding multicultural political philosophy in the realities of specific political problems and contexts. The strength of this chapter is not only that it breathes some life into the practical political stakes of multicultural political philosophy. It also allows normative theorizing about multiculturalism to be guided by concrete struggles. However, the chapter is unfortunately organized like an applied ethics debate textbook, with a description of each case followed by arguments "for" and "against." While this format could be viewed as a strength by the instructor wishing to stage a debate among students, like all such formats, it arguably encourages binary, adversarial thinking about contemporary social and political issues.

Critical Remarks

The text's analytical disregard of differences such as race, gender, sexual orientation, disability, and their intersecting systems of domination is concurrent with its disengagement from critical theories of postcolonialism and feminism. This omission produces a series of problematic symptoms, two of which I will briefly address.

First, Murphy's text distances itself from and reifies minority discourses of critique and activist demand even when it seeks to overcome that distance. For example, contextualist political philosophy, as Murphy indicates in the final substantive chapter, has sought to overcome the excessive degree of theoretical abstraction that has plagued much of twentieth-century Anglo-American political philosophy. This distance from concrete struggles and injustices, he writes, "was undermining [political philosophy's] persuasive power and its relevance to public policy and institutional design" (p. 129). One of the aspirations of contextualist political philosophy is thus to be "more sensitive to the specific claims, characteristics and circumstances of different cultural minorities" (ibid., my emphasis). While this is a welcome departure from "ideal" methods of political theorizing that, as a matter of principle, exclude, or at least marginalize, such actualities from critical interrogation (Mills 2005, Tessman), the way that Murphy's text articulates this aim reinscribes the very distance it is intended to overcome.

The objective of contextualist political philosophy is described as one of being "more empirically informed," closer to "the facts on the ground" (ibid., my emphasis). Such philosophy would then, we are told, attend to minority demands, qua "facts," and theorize how they "could be justified and accommodated in policy terms" (ibid.). Murphy erroneously categorizes minority discourses of critique and activist demand as empirical facts to be extrinsically "justified" by theory and "accommodated" by policy rather than as normative and theoretical discourses in their own right -- discourses to be addressed at the level of the concepts and values they articulate, the justifications they offer in support of those values, and the norms for governance they propose. The methodological exclusion of these perspectives qua normative discourses at the outset, facilitates their reification in the belated attempt to contextually incorporate them. Put bluntly, it's difficult to ultimately overcome the "distance" between Anglo-American multicultural political philosophy and the specific claims, characteristics, and circumstances of different cultural minorities so long as that philosophy excludes those claims and perspectives from its conceptual horizons on account of a "lack of space" (pp. 129, 62, 7). Here, as elsewhere, the methodological and organizational framework of Murphy's text forecloses the possibility for genuine recognition of and dialogue with marginalized and oppressed groups, and the theoretical and practical (including policy) innovation which could result from that dialogue.

A second, related problem with Murphy's text is that it is animated by what postcolonial theorist Homi Bhabha calls a nondifferential concept of cultural time:

It is not that liberalism does not recognize racial or sexual discrimination -- it has been in the forefront of those struggles. But there is a recurrent problem with its notion of equality: liberalism contains a nondifferential concept of cultural time. At the point at which liberal discourse attempts to normalise cultural respect into the recognition of equal cultural worth, it does not recognize the disjunctive, 'borderline,' temporalities of partial, minority cultures. The sharing of equality is genuinely intended, but only so long as we start from a historically congruent space; the recognition of difference is genuinely felt, but on terms that do not represent the historical genealogies, often postcolonial, that constitute the partial cultures of the minority. (Bhabha, p. 32; my emphasis)

Murphy's terms do not represent the historical, postcolonial, post-enslavement genealogies that constitute many of the minority cultures at issue in his discussion. In fact, in Murphy's 150-page book (196 pages with notes, bibliography, and index), histories of colonization and domination are only generically intimated in but a handful of references when not obfuscated by euphemisms such as, for example, the suggestion that dominant majority groups and "ethnonational minority communities," such as indigenous peoples, have been "thrown together by historical circumstances" (p. 125).[3] This eclipse of European imperialism enables Murphy, in chapter four, to trace the intellectual origins of multicultural political philosophy not to the claims, concepts, and normative trajectories of the many (antiracist, anticapitalist, anticolonial, queer, indigenous, feminist) social movements of the early- to mid-twentieth century and their refugees in the diaspora. Rather, he traces those intellectual origins to "the many refugees [sic!] from the liberal-communitarian debate that so dominated western political philosophy in the 1970s and 1980s" (p. 46). As such, Murphy's Multiculturalism advances an ethnocentric, methodologically parochial account of the philosophy of multiculturalism that renders invisible the way that it has been shaped by colonial histories -- what Sneja Gunew calls the "colonial seeds of multiculturalism" -- and forecloses the possibility for genuine recognition of and dialogue with marginalized and oppressed groups (Gunew, p. 33).

To those who might object that many of the references I've criticized Murphy for disregarding in his volume are not works of political philosophy, but rather history, social, cultural, and legal theory, I would reply that the topic and task of critical multicultural or postcolonial political philosophy requires an openness to the multicultural questioning and redrawing of the traditional methodological, disciplinary, and thematic horizons of western political philosophy. The strict -- strictly western, white, masculine, heteronormative -- conception of political philosophy is precisely that which a genuinely critical multiculturalism calls upon us to "provincialize" (Brown 1988; Chakrabarty; Dotson; Mills 1997, 1998, 2005; Pateman; Patemanand Mills; Smith).



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[1] The work of Susan Miller Okin is discussed as one of two critical perspectives in chapter seven, "The Limits of Multicultural Accommodation," pp. 96-101.

[2] The article of Waldron's upon which Murphy's argument relies opens with an extended passage from Salman Rushdie, in which Rushdie argues for the hybridity, impurity, and temporal disjunction of cultural identity. Explicating and adopting this conception for his own argument, Waldron writes dismissively: "If I knew what the term meant, I would say it was a 'postmodern' vision of the self. But, as I do not, let me just call it 'cosmopolitan'" (Waldron, p. 95).

[3] Indigenous philosopher Kyle Whyte refers to obfuscating euphemistic language such as this, specifically when employed to describe indigenous peoples, as "political obliviousness," about which he provides insightful critical analysis (Whyte, pp. 178-182).