Murderous Consent: On the Accommodation of Violent Death

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Marc Crépon, Murderous Consent: On the Accommodation of Violent Death, Michael Loriaux and Jacob Levi (trs.), Fordham University Press, 2019, 216pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823283743.

Reviewed by Matthias Fritsch, Concordia University


In this passionate and tightly argued monograph, Marc Crépon makes a case against what he calls ‘murderous consent,’ by which he means the often tacit assent to killing or letting die other human beings, for instance in war or in the everyday famine that characterizes globalization today. Ably translated from the French by Michael Loriaux and Jacob Levi (Le consentement meurtrier. Paris: Les éditions du Cerf, 2012), the book continues Crépon’s previous reflections on what it means to live with others in murderous times (‘living with’ becoming a technical phrase for him, as in his 2008 Vivre avec. La pensée de la mort et la mémoire des guerres. Paris: Hermann, and his 2014 La vocation de l’écriture. La littérature et la philosophie a` l’épreuve de la violence. Paris: Odile Jacob, published in English translation in 2018 by SUNY Press as The Vocation of Writing). Perhaps still relatively unknown outside of France, in the English-speaking world Crépon’s work has already been the subject of a special journal edition (The New Centennial Review, Spring 2018). Overall, Crépon tries to develop a philosophy of nonviolence that counters, by philosophical and literary means, the death-dealing forces of hatred and indifference that have made recent histories so brutal and continue to be all around us today.

The overall argument of his book could be summarized by saying that, de jure, the obligation of ‘living-with’ — namely, to let others live, and prohibit murder absolutely — is universally human, but de facto, it is violated by all kinds of rationalizations and forms of identity that restrict its scope. The task then is to highlight the merely factual, strategic or pragmatic nature of these justifications for consenting to murder. But Crépon does not make things easy for himself, for he accepts that the violations of the de jure obligation are “an unavoidable feature of our way of living in and sharing the world” (6). This entails that no one is safe and no one is innocent. And it imposes on us the theoretical duty to sort through and distinguish various degrees of participation in murderous consent, from willful ignorance, neglect, or indifference in the face of famine or war, to active and hateful participation in killing. We also must come to better understand the psychological and political reasons for the gap between the obligation and its violation. Above all, we should prevent lifting the violations and their rationalizations up to the rule of law, as the logic of political sovereignty seems to demand, or letting these justifications affect the ineradicable and universal duty to care for the singular and mortal vulnerability of all human beings.

Crépon’s book carries out this theoretical program in five chapters (plus an introduction, a brief conclusion on killing animals, and a short appendix on friendships against the backdrop of the violent 20th century). Each chapter is focused on a concept linked to murderous consent, and focused on a writer or thinker: Camus on justice, Freud on life, Levinas and Grossman on freedom, Butler and Kraus on truth, and Anders on the world. Other thinkers are engaged in passing, from the care ethics of Tronto to Derrida’s ethical-political aporias.

Chapter 1 (“Justice”) discusses Camus’s literary and philosophical writing, chiefly The Rebel and its attempt, in the aftermath of WWII, to find a response to ideologies of war, whether nationalist or not, that justify killing. Crépon discusses Camus’s diagnosis of our era as one of nihilism, defined not as Nietzsche’s ‘devaluation of all value’ or the ‘death of God’ but the proliferation of justifications for murder, pitting one such justification against another in particular during the bloody 20th century. Camus is said to have understood that in these ideological wars, all motivated by their own conceptions of exclusive justice, what becomes eclipsed is the “mutual complicity of men [sic],” the recognition of the appeal of the other against violence. Murder always divides people, while mortal vulnerability is universal and cosmopolitan (27). But Camus also saw “the paradox”, namely that the “rebellion” in the name of this human complicity cannot renounce violence entirely (18, 27, 41). While we are all united by a shared and relational vulnerability, no one can escape murderous consent (46). Crépon elaborates Camus’s response to this paradox by imposing three conditions on rebellion: the restrictions just law imposes on the freedom of the rebel, her commitment to life ‘beyond nihilism’, and the awareness of the contradiction that lies in fighting violence with violence, that is, feeling the “effraction” that stems from “the foundational anteriority of nonviolence” (41). The rebel would be characterized by a kind of Socratic humility: as Camus writes, “he who does not know everything cannot kill everything” (Camus, cited on p. 39).

This distinction between two forms of violence (that of the rebel and that of the nationalist or nihilist) is of course fragile. The rebel would be permitted to use violence if it meets these conditions and remains provisional, without hardening into yet another rationalizing identity or future ideology (42). And yet, rebellion is said to carry the implicit promise of a “world not torn apart by the antagonism of murderous consent” (27) — a promise hard to distinguish from another future vision that justifies violence. Nonetheless, Crépon maintains with Camus that, as soon as the rebel justifies her violence, she justifies murderous consent (44). Here, one might have wished Crépon had pursued the fragility — or indeed, the paradox or Derridean “aporia” (19, 70) — of this distinction further, for example by discussing the burgeoning literature on civil disobedience, so relevant to today.

Chapter 2, entitled “Life”, turns to Freud, chiefly to examine the illusion that, generally speaking, murderous consent is external to life, when in fact evil and cruelty cannot, for the Freud Crépon here makes his own, be eradicated. In Freud’s reflections on WWI, this illusion often takes the form of thinking that the ‘legacy of human civilization’ is founded on protecting human life, on accepting the obligations of ‘living-with’. But is not murderous consent hiding itself all the more effectively under the smokescreen of ‘civilization’, in whose name Europe colonized large parts of the world during a period implicitly idealized by Freud? For Freud — thus betraying his Eurocentric view — it is not the colonialism of the 19th century but WWI that shatters the illusion that Europe is protected from cruelty and the pleasure to kill, an illusion that also extends to the sense that ‘we’ are safe, that the state will protect us even if it does not protect others (55-6).

Crépon then pursues another “paradox” (73): Freud’s well-known account of both the antagonism and the complementarity between the life drives and the death drive. While the former extend the obligations of living-with to outgroups and others by way of “civilization” (52), the death drive and its aggressions may turn outward from the very demands of culture, especially if these demands are not sufficiently compensated and life remains precarious (71). The always fragile solution can then only lie in making life more secure for all, and in mobilizing the life drives (71) despite their feeding on repression and owing their force in part to the death drive. Here, too, one may feel that the paradox would deserve more elaboration, in particular because the next chapter seems to assert the opposite of Freud’s conclusion. On the crucial issue of why the violations of living-with are inevitable, Crépon writes both that life is “in essence” violently murderous (discussing Freud’s view, p. 64) and that it is not (discussing Grossman’s view, p. 88). Hence, one might hope that Crépon, in his enticing and pertinent readings of various authors, explained his own position and spoke in his own voice with greater clarity.

Chapter 3 treats “Freedom” by reading Levinas reading Vasily Grossman’s novel Life and Fate (as well as the later Everything Flows, which Levinas, to my knowledge, never references). The focus shifts from war to famine as Crépon masterfully examines, with Grossman’s account of Stalinist terror, how hunger and its threat undermine freedom. Human neediness gives tyrants all the tools they need to invert freedom into servitude and murderous consent. Aware that hunger reduces freedom to powerlessness, Levinas is read as responding to Grossman by redefining freedom as the responsibility to feed the hungry, which indeed Levinas sees as the first obligation. In the context of contemporary globalization, which makes millions die every year due to malnutrition and lack of access to basic health care — in Crépon’s blunt words, globalization equals “consent to mass murder” (76) — both hunger and freedom are thus re-conceptualized here.

Hunger is displaced from an appetite of life to the privation of the other pleading for food. Freedom is in turn no longer the assertion of a sovereign subject whose rights social and political institutions have to protect — thereby giving them justification to kill or let die by distinguishing the free citizen from others, whether (potentially inimical) noncitizen or stateless. Rather, freedom is rethought as the moral imperative demanding recognition for the singular life that brings new and unique meaning to life and death (88). For Levinas, it is only such singularity, which adversity always seeks to reduce to mere traits or categories of identity, that issues the command “Though shalt not kill”. With Levinas, we here approach a definition of the book’s crucial term of violence, reminiscent of what Camus had called ‘effraction’: the refusal to recognize the face pleading for food and life, treating the other instead as merely a force to be calculated (91). Thus, freedom is here magnificently and significantly reconceptualized, not only in terms of relationality and responsibility, but from the perspective of its possible reversal: for the victim, its conversion by hunger into servitude; for the perpetrator, into the license to kill, let die, and silence the other’s demand for nourishment.

The discussion toward the end of this chapter becomes denser, as Crépon makes the transition to Chapter 4 (“Truth”, primarily on Butler and Kraus) and Chapter 5 (“World”, primarily on Günther Anders’s reflections on living with others in the world after Hiroshima). In transitioning to the themes of language, truth, and world, Crépon treats another paradox, that of Levinas’s face: despite demanding not to be killed, the face is the only ‘thing’ — precisely by not being a ‘thing’ — that tempts murder. As preceding and withdrawing from every constitution by consciousness, hence utterly transcendent to the world, the mortal face commands to responsibility, and only in such responsibility, we should add — though Crépon does not elaborate and clarify this important Levinasian argument — does freedom emerge.

But Crépon skillfully analyzes the paradox further. The very transcendence and demandingness of the uncircumventable face motivates turning it into what Levinas calls a ‘caricature’, an untruth accompanied by all sorts of linguistic ruses: names, diminutives, and narratives that engender hatred or indifference (97). Chapter 4 analyzes, in particular, naming practices (from name-calling, such as ‘enemy,’ ‘vermin,’ ‘terrorist,’ ‘rogue state,’ to what gets defined by law as ‘crime’, ‘murder,’ etc.) and narrative (nationalist, ethnocentrist, etc.). Murderous narratives are discussed by reference to Karl Kraus’s anti-war writings in the wake of WWI and Butler’s ‘frames of war’ in the aftermath of 9/11 and subsequent US wars. In part through these linguistic practices, murderous consent divides our being-in-the-world, which otherwise tends, for Crépon, into a different form of globalization, or worldwide-ization: the moral extension from the face to all other faces, regardless of their caricatures, and thus into a concern for the world (10, 92, 100). Though language permits these caricatures, it is, for Levinas, also the opening onto the other, putting into question one’s sovereign, possessive appropriation of the world. As the last two chapters argue, murder denies both the other’s imperative (turning away from the victim’s face, e.g., by the “telemurder” of killing at a distance, p. 166) and the sharing of world opened by language (refusing to converse with the other). The very meaning of ‘world’ is thus tied to responsibility, for we know that, in Levinas’s words, “our misfortunes come from our neighbours” (cited p. 106). This has never been more true than today, in the age of nuclear weapons, terrorism, and climate change (110), thus motivating the turn in the final chapter to Anders and his reflections on sharing world after Hiroshima and Nagasaki.

This sharing, however, is complicated from the beginning by the fact of unequal distributions of vulnerability and of the means to act on responsibility. The penultimate chapter thus turns to Butler’s use of Levinas complemented by Foucaultian genealogies of power (despite Butler’s innovative re-elaboration, especially in Frames of War, of Levinas with Foucault, the latter is not mentioned in Crépon’s book). Notwithstanding the universally shared vulnerability to murder, and the shared call to responsibility, Crépon agrees with Butler and Foucault that no objective truth, no metalanguage, is available on who is more exposed to violence, as our perspectives on this are necessarily local, situated within plural “geographies of vulnerabilities” and “frames of understanding” or “frames of mourning” that distinguish worthy from less worthy victims (111, 127, 131).

The final chapter continues this analysis of ‘world’, morally extended but politically divided by murderous consent, by drawing on Anders and on Kenzaburō Ōe’s writing in the wake of Hiroshima. Crépon analyzes the nuclear threat in the Cold War and, at its ‘end’ in the late 1980s, the various displacements of the enemy of the self-styled ‘free world,’ justifying the retention of nuclear arsenals and new wars. Referencing Derrida’s account of ‘auto-immunity’ in the wake of 9/11, Crépon once more pursues the paradox of this logic of murderous consent: to protect itself against real and imagined ‘enemies’, the allegedly ‘free world’ wages wars, stockpiles weapons dangerous even to itself, and perverts its own freedom (144). In response, the world needs to be rethought from the perspective of the threat of “humanity’s self-destruction” (163) — “a different thought of the world emerging as the rejoinder to the nihilism of our time” (170), what Crépon ends up calling an “ethicosmopolitics” (9, 171).

There is much to admire in this powerful examination, both philosophical and literary, of the murderous hypocrisies at the heart of our lives today. If I permit myself some all-too-brief critical remarks, it is to further its necessary and worthy motivation. As indicated, the introduction referred to the need to distinguish various degrees of murderous consent, even if, from the perspective of human responsibility, all are blameworthy. Consider the distinctions among ignorance, neglect, indifference to preventable deaths elsewhere, or active killing, unjust or ‘just war’ (if such a thing can be justified), and so on. In fact, however, as the overview above shows, the book’s foci are such that it can deliver little of this, beginning with the fundamental distinction between killing and letting die, which has generated so much philosophical literature recently, including the more general distinction between doing and allowing.

A final point concerns Crépon’s frequent evocation of Derrida’s moral and political aporias in line with his own reflections on paradoxes (19, 144, 156, 196, 206). Here, Derrida’s basic argument that facing moral aporias, as the ordeal of the undecidable, do not simply limit but also make possible responsibility, would have strengthened Crépon’s own emphasis on the paradoxes of murderous consent. Further, Derrida’s account of the link between capital punishment and modern political sovereignty (which reserves the right to declare war or kill, and thereby clearly demarcates sovereign from animal), is similarly pertinent, as Crépon notes (197n7). However, he fails to take account of the fact that Derrida criticizes sovereignty’s assertion of the right over life and death for justifying itself most often by appealing to a life or value higher than mere life or animal life (immortal life, reason, honor, justice, dignity, etc.), not only in principled defenders of capital punishment, such as Kant and Hegel, but also in the abolitionist discourses of Victor Hugo and, explicitly, in Camus’s work.1

The invocation of the Camusian rebel’s higher value of human ‘complicity’ and ‘justice’ — as well as the subsequent demands of human responsibility in Levinas and others — would thus have to be subjected to a thoroughgoing examination as to its collusion with the very logic Crépon pits it against. And in our times of an increasingly common world with massively unequal vulnerabilities, whose unity and disunity is marked by the realities of climate change, nuclear proliferation, and global hunger, this may be one of the most important questions with which Crépon leaves us: what is permitted to the ‘rebel’ of civil disobedience, and in the name of which value or life can she speak and act against murderous consent?

1 Jacques Derrida, The Death Penalty, Volume 1, trans. Peggy Kamuf. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2014.