Must Politics Be War?: Restoring Our Trust in the Open Society

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Kevin Vallier, Must Politics Be War?: Restoring Our Trust in the Open Society, Oxford University Press, 2019, 243pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190632830.

Reviewed by Douglas I. Thompson, University of South Carolina


American history is full of episodes in which politics descended into armed conflict. The Civil War is the most obvious case; the organized massacres during the catastrophic end of Reconstruction also come to mind, as do the armed labor conflicts of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. In all of these instances, the shooting stopped; war turned back into politics. But what kind of politics? In the case of the Civil War, the landowning oligarchs who dominated the antebellum South were defeated on the battlefield. Here, war gave way to democratic politics, as African-American voter registration approached 90 percent in some of the former Confederate states. Multiparty elections took place, Republicans held office for the first time, and democratic state constitutions were ratified. The democratization of the South was short-lived, however. When the Army withdrew in 1877, the oligarchs and their poorer white allies fought to regain power and won. By the 1890s, all of the former Confederate states had re-established authoritarian regimes that violently suppressed competitive multiparty elections, severely limited suffrage, and abrogated fundamental democratic rights of free speech, a free press, and freedom of assembly, even for white southerners. The guiding purpose of these regimes was to approximate, as closely as possible, the labor-repressive agriculture system that had been the centerpiece of the antebellum political economy. With slavery abolished, the new system was policed through debt peonage and other disciplinary techniques -- and through unspeakable public displays of torture and killing. The authoritarian enclaves of the former Confederacy persisted well into the 1960s, decades after the region's long-delayed industrialization. Millions of Americans are alive today who remember what life was like under brutal authoritarian rule in the U.S.

Must politics be war? In this case, the violence of war was baked into American politics for a century through formal and informal relations of domination. What about the (literal) battles between capital and labor that took place as the Northeast and West industrialized? By the turn of the twentieth century, capital had won. The Lochner court routinely stuck down popular laws that would ban or regulate child labor and other exploitative industrial practices. The property rights of factory owners and investors were sacrosanct and safeguarded against democracy, even as inequality and poverty were systemically pervasive. But then the global economy collapsed in 1929. The pro-capital, laissez-faire Republican Party was publicly discredited by 1932, and Roosevelt had defeated the Republican-appointed Lochner court by 1937-38. The New Deal restructured constitutional law and the national political economy. Social democracy won. And it was a victory, not a compromise. Democrats held majorities in Congress almost continuously until the mid-1990s. As the Democrat-dominated federal government built the first mass middle-class consumer society in American history through social-democratic welfare-state programs and massive housing subsidies (for white Americans only), the anti-New Deal business leaders who once dominated the Republican Party were relegated to the sidelines of political power.

When we lament the extreme political polarization and hyper-partisanship of today, we are implicitly comparing ourselves to this era, the decades after WWII. Levels of political polarization were then significantly lower than at any other time in American history, including the present, and interparty cooperation was therefore much more forthcoming. But this was made possible by the fact that the really momentous conflicts -- over the basic structure of the domestic economy, the distribution of income and wealth, and the racial makeup of the electorate -- had been taken off the table, either through local violence and federal indifference (in the question of race) or by the force of overwhelming numbers (in the question of social democracy). Anti-New Deal Republicans had simply lost, and the federal government was dominated by a Democratic Party that had to placate its powerful authoritarian Southern members to maintain its majoritarian hold on power. This was the compromise at the heart of this era of cooperation.

These conditions no longer hold. Racially conservative whites from the South and beyond defected to the Republican Party before, during, and after the Democrat-induced democratization of the former Confederacy in the 1960s, thereby altering the balance of power between the parties. Meanwhile, by the 1970s, defeated anti-New Deal business leaders had constructed an impressive array of foundations and think tanks that amounted to an alternative political party organization bent on destroying social democracy. These organizations have since grown in size and power and have become a dominant force within the Republican Party.

The main fault lines in American politics on fundamental questions of political economy and race are now organized neatly along partisan lines. Today, the Democratic Party is a highly diverse coalition of voters that embraces a racially and ethnically inclusive picture of American national identity and seeks to preserve social democracy. Meanwhile, the Republican party is a highly homogenous coalition of voters who have increasingly embraced an exclusive picture of a white Christian national identity. The party's highly organized, wealthy donor class remains laser-focused on undermining and even destroying social democracy -- and are evidently willing to stimulate white racial resentment to gain support for this unpopular position.

The stakes could not be higher. Over the past four decades, 90 percent of American workers have watched their incomes stagnate while the incomes and wealth of the top 1 percent have skyrocketed, fueled especially by the astronomic gains of the top .01 percent. While welfare-state redistribution has diminished significantly over the same period, the effects of remaining redistributive programs are still powerful. Today, the bottom 50 percent of American adults -- over 117 million people -- earn an average annual pre-tax income of only $16,200. After taxes and redistribution, they make $24,800, an increase of over 50 percent. The bottom 20 percent of American adults earn an average pre-tax income of $5,400 per year, which increases to $13,100 after taxes and redistribution -- barely above the official poverty line.[1] The social and personal effects of these growing disparities of income and wealth are devastating. Residents of the wealthiest U.S. counties live 20 years longer than residents of the poorest U.S. counties, where people have shorter average lives than in many developing countries.[2] Average national U.S. life expectancy is in decline -- a social and economic indicator historically associated with war or plague. Those at the top of the distribution have thus far been immune from these trends, living longer and longer. If current levels of welfare-state redistribution suddenly ceased, millions of Americans would be thrust into abject poverty. It is not at all clear that democracy in America could survive such a radical shock, yet the massive donor organizations bankrolling one of the two main political parties openly profess this as their goal.

Must politics be war? Perhaps not, but it is striking how closely the current divisions in American politics hew to fault lines that were shaped by past armed conflict, especially when it comes to race and economic power.

What does American political philosophy have to say about this perilous historical moment? When Kevin Vallier writes that "American politics is more divided today than at any point since the Civil War," he is referring, even if only implicitly, to this context (1). As Vallier recognizes, this division is a matter of party-mediated conflict, in which "a spirit of hardened partisanship has made political compromise, even on issues where compromise is needed, all but impossible" (1). The question is: Does it have to be this way? Vallier's answer is a resounding no. Skillfully maneuvering in the well-worn grooves of contractualist moral philosophy, Vallier constructs an attractive picture of an alternative American society bound together through practices of public reason grounded in moral relationships of mutual trust. If we could just find a way to trust each other -- and actually be trustworthy enough that this trust is justified -- then we would surely be more inclined to pursue policies that we could justify to our fellow citizens. Just as important, we might be more willing to accept the good-faith justifications of the "other side," even if we do not always agree with them.

I have tremendous sympathy with Vallier's project, and I agree with his conclusion that liberal social democracy is the only form of government that can be openly and publicly justified to a large, diverse population. Vallier's argument to this effect is beautifully constructed and penetratingly clear. His decision to ground an account of public reason in the sociologically plausible experience of trust is especially innovative and welcome. This is an exemplary book within its genre.

But I had a nagging feeling as I read it that there was something missing. And then it hit me: In a book that purports to ask if (small-d) democratic party politics must behave like "war by other means," there is no substantive discussion of parties or partisanship. The mutually trusting Americans imagined in the book are simply not caught in the historical net of party identity and influence. They are individuals with different "beliefs," not partisans with strong political in-group identities and the sticky mess of tribal interests and emotions that go along with these. In the book's various chapters, they can be seen making individual moral choices about how to treat other individuals; they can be seen expressing their individual preferences about what kind of constitution to adopt; and they can be seen choosing to obey laws. But these activities revolve entirely around individual orientations toward moral and legal rules. At no point is anyone depicted doing anything resembling competitive electoral politics.

This is an odd omission. How is it possible to say something about partisan politics without saying anything about partisan politics? What's going on here? I think the issue has to do with the choice of methodological approach. Vallier has produced an exemplary version of the familiar move of applying contractualist moral philosophy to politics. But contractualist moral philosophy isn't really structured to say much of substance about circumstances of partisan political conflict because it always treats citizens as an unorganized mass of independent, individual moral agents who have different ethical beliefs but are already motivated to cooperate. It is this idealizing move that has allowed contractualist moral philosophy to produce hundreds (thousands?) of plausible (and very similar) justifications of liberal democracy as the most broadly legitimate form of government available today. This is ultimately what Vallier does, and he does an excellent job of it. But a general justification of liberalism is not the same thing as a substantive normative examination of the kinds of partisan conflicts that always shape the political aspects of liberal democracy. Vallier's book doesn't do this, and I'm not sure that it's something that contractualist moral philosophy can do.

To see what I mean, let us look at the "moderate idealization" at the heart of Vallier's account of politics. Vallier's political actors are an a-partisan mass of individual moral "persons" who are "adequately rational and informed" (10), who arrive at their political preferences through "a respectable amount of reasoning" (71), who "are interested in sustaining moral trust with others," and who "are interested in moral relationships with one another" (96). To avoid the jarringly unrealistic idealizing premises of perfect rationality, reasonableness, and information that plague many versions of moral contractualism, Vallier sensibly portrays his individual moral choosers as "boundedly rational" (99). However, he does not give an explanation of what this means. This omission is enormously important because, as any political scientist will tell you, the most significant "bound" that both enables and constrains ordinary citizens' reasoning about politics is partisan identity.[3] The evidence is massive and unequivocal: Voters simply do not "have" exogenously-given preferences or even ideological commitments prior to interaction with party-mediated political communication. Instead, voters learn what their political preferences should be largely through cues and frames given by party elites, to whom they become attached for reasons of social-group identity. Our reasoning about political matters is thereby inherently "bounded" by -- is biased towards and shaped by -- our partisan identities, which most of us acquire through involuntary childhood socialization, not purely independent choice.

This is not a fault of democratic politics; it is instead a condition of its possibility. In a policy environment of virtually infinite complexity, voters need shortcuts to sort out what the salient issues and relevant policy stakes are in a given election cycle. We learn this from our favorite political figures, whom we like because they play for our favorite political "team" and claim to speak for "our kinds of people." And these identities are always forged by past circumstances of conflict like those I outlined previously.

In many cases, even our ethical and religious beliefs and identities are shaped by political messaging. For example, when Roe v. Wade was decided in 1973, the Southern Baptist Convention was initially indifferent, even welcoming it. Convention leaders saw abortion as a Catholic issue -- nothing to do with them. But then abortion became a handy mobilizing tool for national Republican Party strategists, and now many white Southern Baptists (whose parents and grandparents defected to the Republican Party for racial-identity reasons when northern Democrats began to push for civil rights) identify themselves as voting mainly according to that single issue. These voters were evidently socialized into a set of theological positions more through politics than vice versa. Was this an instance of cynical elite manipulation or legitimate, transformative religious education via the political process? As always, it depends on whom you ask.

Either way, this is what bounded rationality looks like in politics, and we are all caught in its net. By conceding this point in the very structure of the theory, though without pursuing it, and by framing the overall argument in terms of mortal political conflict, Vallier invites partisan politics into his book as a noisily-looming absent presence. Must politics be war? No, imagine instead that there were no political parties locked in deep historical conflict with (literally) mortal material stakes, and we were all just independent individual moral agents who are already motivated to trust each other . . . This wouldn't be war, but it wouldn't be politics either. Given the dangerous depth of contemporary American political conflicts, it looks rather like a change of subject.

Meanwhile, the American political system looks to be approaching a crisis point. What does American philosophy have to say about it?

[1] Thomas Piketty, Emmanuel Saez, and Gabriel Zucman, "Distributional National Accounts: Methods and Estimates for the United States," The Quarterly Journal of Economics, Vol. 133, No. 2 (May 2018): 553-609.

[2] Interactive US Health Map, Institute for Health Metrics and Evaluation, March 13, 2018. Accessed July 8, 2019. The map is measuring male residents only.

[3] E.g., Christopher Achen and Larry Bartels, Democracy for Realists: Why Elections Do Not Produce Responsive Government (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2016).