Myth and Philosophy in Plato's Phaedrus

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Daniel S. Werner, Myth and Philosophy in Plato's Phaedrus, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 302pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107021280.

Reviewed by Annie Larivée, Carleton University


The paradox is well known. Although Plato attempted to found philosophy as a discipline of rigorous, precise, unequivocal thinking -- in contrast with other activities that put the affects and imagination into play, such as poetry and rhetoric -- he nevertheless peppered his dialogues with myths that are just as inspiring as they are inspired, with motifs partly invented and partly borrowed from tradition. There are many commentaries on the functions of Platonic myths but most of the available studies either concentrate on one myth (or one type of myth) or propose a general taxonomy aimed at identifying and classifying the various functions of the myths, independent of their context. Daniel S. Werner's book, entirely dedicated to the apparent paradox of the contrast between myth and philosophy, distinguishes itself from the former methods as it finds its own distinct approach. Werner supposes that Plato's myths must be interpreted in the context of the dialogues in which they are found and he concentrates on one sole text, the Phaedrus, a dialogue especially rich in myths, some of which are the most famous in the Platonic corpus. Not only does the author decide to examine all of the Phaedrus' myths in their precise context in the dialogue, he also supposes that the (problematic) unity of this work is more clearly visible in the light of this approach. According to Werner, this focal point, this "unifying thread that ultimately connects the Phaedrus as an individual text to the more general issues of myth is in fact philosophy itself" (13). The Phaedrus would in fact be an essentially metaphilosophic dialogue. This ambitious thesis makes Werner's work much more than a study of the myths contained in the Phaedrus' or even than a complete commentary on the Phaedrus; it is a reflection on Plato's conception of philosophy in light of the Phaedrus' myths.

Aside from the introduction and conclusion, which offer a solid discussion of the interpretive and methodological stakes raised by the text, the work is divided into eight principal parts, which are dedicated either to an attentive examination of the Phaedrus' myths or to the broader questions that these myths raise. The analysis begins with the passage containing the myths of Boreas and Typhon, which has the advantage of raising fundamental questions right from the start concerning the appropriate manner of interpreting the myths, the importance one should grant them, and the function that they may or may not perform in what Socrates regards as a crucial task, namely, knowing the self. Three solid chapters follow, each dedicated to the Phaedrus' mythic pièce de résistance, the Palinode, which enables Werner to develop his position on the relationship between myth, truth, and reason. Werner tackles the crucial theme of the soul and eros in the first chapter, the question of the forms and knowledge in the second, and the way that the Palinode illustrates the link between tradition and philosophy in the third. These are followed by a short and very insightful chapter on the myth of the cicadas and a chapter containing a more thorough treatment of the critique of writing in the myth of Theuth. Two thematic chapters, one concerning the relationship between rhetoric and dialectic and the other on the unity of the Phaedrus complete the work.

In light of his scrupulous investigation Werner concludes that in the Phaedrus the Platonic myths have five primary functions, each linked to philosophy as a way of life: 1) converting young people to philosophy who, like Phaedrus, are capable of devoting themselves to this activity but have only wavering motivation for it (hence a protreptic function), 2) indicating avenues of research to those who are already philosophers, 3) raising second-order questions about language, knowledge, and truth while drawing attention to the limits of human capacities, 4) assuring the unity of the dialogue by literary and structural means, 5) socially legitimizing philosophy as a discipline by borrowing authority from myths as traditional narratives (14, 259-63).[1] Although one could dispute how much weight to attribute to each of these functions (I will return to this), Werner convincingly shows the presence of these functions in the Phaedrus and the manner in which the myths perform them.

Before launching a critical discussion of certain problematic points, let us highlight the strengths of this book. First, the constant attention to the social and historical context in which Plato wrote is impressive. This quality is apparent from the beginning in the explications of the role traditional myths played in Greece (3-7) and it remains present throughout the book, as the section on medicine (170) or the section on the transition from an oral to written culture (182) attest. Werner also shows in detail how Plato constructed his myths by delving into the depths of traditional Greek culture, assimilating and transforming it (12, 112; the section devoted to the Adonia festival that clarifies the myth of Theuth is a good example, 200-02). By paying attention to the way Plato's myths were drawn from traditional mythology one can see the decisive strategic role that Plato accorded to myth in his defence of philosophy as a discipline in Athens at that time. Further, Werner not only sheds light on the Greek heritage of Plato's myths but also draws attention to Indo-European culture with its image of the soul as a winged chariot in the Palinode, for example (110-11) and provides the reader with descriptions of Egyptian culture to clarify the myth of Theuth (190).

In spite of a few exceptions, the author rigorously follows his methodological guiding principle, which consists in adopting a "holistic", "organicist" perspective centred solely on the Phaedrus; he thus avoids the dangers of the "cut-and-paste" approach which handles Plato's myths as though they were semantically autonomous (17). If it is true that the ideas expressed and the arguments exchanged in the dialogues take their meaning from the context in which they are stated, Werner holds that myths are no exception to this rule: they are addressed to certain characters, with a certain goal, in a particular dialogic context, and all of these contextual elements are necessary for understanding them. Applied to the Phaedrus, this methodological choice proves to be fruitful. We understand better, for example, the meaning of the myth of the cicadas or the myth of Theuth if we take into account the goal pursued by Socrates -- who appears here as a physician of the soul -- when he administers them to Phaedrus (and by extension the readers of the dialogue, 153, 167-70). This method also sheds light on the 'palinodic' nature of the dialogue, which frequently returns to the same metaphilosophical stakes in various ways (246). In short, this book, in the esprit de finesse, is opposed to the analytic sort of interpretations that are content with dissecting the arguments without any regard for the dramatic or historical context of the dialogue as a discursive act.

Werner also shows his finesse by refusing to embrace an interpretive monism according to which there would only be one central theme in the Phaedrus. He subscribes rather to the idea of a "thematic pluralism" (239-240). Of course, revealing the unity of the dialogue in light of this link between myth and philosophy matters to him and he shows his hermeneutic ambition by explicitly claiming to offer a "more fruitful" interpretation than most of the preceding ones (268). It is more fruitful because it is more complete, no doubt more detailed, but above all perhaps because it is more unified and more powerful due to the importance it grants philosophy (its value, its limits, its social valorisation, its educative and psychagogic power). Yet in spite of this declared ambition, Werner avoids the excess of claiming that it is the one and only central theme of the Phaedrus. Thus we should not conclude that the rather limited attention he pays to the central theme of eros in the Phaedrus means that he denies its importance. This esprit de finesse nevertheless is sometimes accompanied by an interpretive boldness, which exposes his reading to serious criticisms, notably with regard to the limited epistemological value that he grants to dialectic, its proximity to myth, and its assimilation with what Socrates describes as the true rhetorical technique. I will begin my critical examination with the problematic interpretative use that Werner makes of the 'epistemology' presented by Socrates in the Palinode.

Concerning the relationship between myth and knowledge, Werner places himself between what he calls the "Dogmatic View" of myth and the "Debunking View" (11, 14, 95). According to the first, Platonic myths contain philosophical ideas to which Plato subscribes and they enable him to transmit knowledge (on the destiny of the soul for example, or its true nature). The second completely denigrates myths, seeing nothing of philosophical knowledge in them. Werner seems to adopt an intermediary approach in that he clearly rejects the Dogmatic View, while maintaining that Platonic myth is somehow linked to philosophical knowledge insofar as it aids the conversion to philosophy, establishes its social authority, and incites philosophers to pursue their investigations while remaining aware of the limits of their discipline, etc. I will not discuss the respective merits of the two conceptions between which Werner places himself. My goal in what follows consists simply in pointing to those (several) points of Werner's interpretation of the Phaedrus where he seems to be inconsistent in his rejection of the Dogmatic View.

According to Werner, the Dogmatic View is untenable because it clashes with the 'epistemology' of the Palinode, a myth in which knowledge is presented as the direct vision of the Forms by a disembodied soul. Indeed, the Platonic myth (be it the Palinode or any other) does not offer such an experience; taking the form of a discourse addressed to an embodied soul, the ideas it expresses are transmitted by the mediation of language and do not at all imply a direct 'vision' of the Forms. The Dogmatic View would thus be erroneous because it is inconsistent; once applied to the Palinode it becomes self-refuting (see chap. 4 "The Palinode. Forms and Knowledge", 88-107).

I do not claim that Werner is wrong to reject the Dogmatic View on such a basis (presenting an alternative way of correctly interpreting the myths with 'philosophic' content would require lengthy expositions). He seems to fall into inconsistency himself, however, by frequently using certain ideas presented in the Palinode in his text as if they were well-established doctrines.

Thus, throughout his work Werner does not hesitate to use the distinction between the embodied and disembodied states of the soul as though it were a piece of Platonic dogma. Is it not the case, however, that this distinction is evoked solely by mythological means in the Phaedrus? (Let us not forget that he has refused recourse to other dialogues in his interpretation, 16). Given his rejection of the Dogmatic View, why does Werner refer to this distinction as though it were an established fact, a truth? This applies equally to his use of the conception of the soul as a tripartite and self-moving entity. Werner frequently employs these ideas put forward by Socrates in the Palinode to explain how Platonic myths are supposed to act upon Phaedrus' soul or that of the reader (by virtue of, for example, a protreptic effect). For instance, he explains that since Socrates declares "the essence of the soul to be self-motion", the protreptic effect of Platonic myths must by consequence consist in inciting an internal or "intrapersonal" process of persuasion in the soul (75). Another example: he holds that since the soul is composed of diverse powers (which Werner takes for true although this idea is only presented in the Palinode myth), we can suppose that the myth exerts its psychagogic effect by addressing itself principally to thymos, the element symbolized by the white horse in the myth (68-75). There are countless passages where Werner makes this sort of positive use of elements contained in the Palinode, as if Socrates were laying down a doctrinal teaching there.[2] Let us sum up by saying that although he explicitly rejects the Dogmatic View on the pretext of its incoherence, he persistently uses Socrates' psycho-epistemological ideas from the Palinode to support his own theses on the functions and techniques of myth, which suggests that Werner implicitly subscribes to a doctrinal reading of certain elements of this myth. To remain consistent, however, one must choose: either claim the right to make dogmatic use of the Palinode (in its entirety or in part) and admit an (at least partial) adherence to the Dogmatic View, or uphold the rejection and avoid all recourse to the content of the Palinode (such as the tripartition, the self-moving character of the soul, the embodied/disembodied opposition, etc.) for describing how Platonic myths exert their persuasive effect.[3]

The most serious consequence of implicitly accepting a dogmatic interpretation of the Palinode's epistemological passage is the devaluation of dialectic on the scale of knowledge, which is indicated by the provocative declaration "the difference between mythical discourse and philosophical discourse is one of degree and not of kind" (15, 217). Indeed, Werner relies on that passage in the Palinode not only to establish the inferior epistemological status (and subordinate position) of myth to dialectic but also to show that, in spite of its superiority, dialectic turns out to be much more akin to myth than it is to real knowledge (as described in the Palinode). The argument rests on the same reasoning that was used to reject the Dogmatic View of the myth: given that dialectic is an activity consisting in a linguistic exchange between embodied individuals and not in direct contemplation of the Forms by a disembodied soul, it does not satisfy Plato's criteria for real knowledge (90-100). Apart from the fact that attributing ideas to Plato on the basis of what is said by characters in a dialogue requires some justification (especially coming from a commentator who wishes to found his interpretation on a single dialogue without any regard for the rest of the corpus), here again this decision rests, paradoxically, on a dogmatic acceptance of the Palinode myth's explanations of how the soul learns and knows. But there is more.

According to Werner, the philosophic virtue of the Palinode's epistemological remarks consists in leading the dialectician to recognize the limits of his activity (since, insofar as he is incarnated, he is condemned to discourse and has only indirect access to the Forms by means of recollection). This idea, however, gives rise to several objections. First, one could object that such a role conflicts with the protreptic function that Werner attributes to the myths in the Phaedrus. Indeed, is it plausible that a myth could provoke, in certain favourably disposed souls, a conversion to an existence dedicated to philosophy by emphasizing the radically limited and insufficient character of this activity? The tone of the Palinode clearly seems to aim at feeding the desire and ambition of the philosopher rather than limiting his ardour by reminding him of the limits of the human condition. Second, one could ask the following question: if the Palinode really aims at raising the philosopher's awareness of the limited character of dialectic, is it philosophically appropriate to expect that such a realization will occur through an act of faith in a mythical narrative? Or does this not amount to a pure and simple abdication of this exercise of the intelligence which Plato calls dialectic? If he were dedicated to the knowledge of the Forms, why would the philosopher passively subscribe to a mythological description of the essence of knowing rather than making it the object of a dialectical examination, as Socrates does in the Theaetetus for example? And the same applies to the Forms -- should one not attempt to submit them to such an examination as well (of which we find an outline in the Parmenides, for example)? Is it worthy of a philosopher to passively accept the mythological image according to which knowledge consists in an immediate 'vision' of the Forms (which Werner declares "ineffable", 98) by the disembodied soul without ever asking what such an experience consists in, or why one should subscribe to such a view? In fact, although Werner overtly rejects what he calls a "yogic" conception of the myth (according to which the myth would enable the soul to accede to a level inaccessible to reason, 12, 100-02), and given that he uses the Palinode in an implicitly dogmatic way so as to diminish the epistemological status of dialectic, he nevertheless seems to subscribe to such a yogic conception of philosophical knowledge in Plato.

One way of avoiding these contradictions as well as the overly radical devaluation of dialectic's epistemological status in light of the Palinode's mythical epistemology would be to ascribe greater importance to the political function of the myth than Werner does. Political in the sense that the epistemological passage of the Palinode perhaps aims less at instructing philosophers on the nature of knowledge than giving them prestige (in that they are portrayed as possessing souls that have 'seen' the most and who have greater control over their chariot) and to thereby establish the authority of their discipline at a social level. In the wake of Andre Nightingale's works, Werner evokes Plato's struggle to have philosophy socially recognized as a discipline (6-7, 119-121), but he does not seem to consider that the epistemological section of the Palinode could be playing such a role. Let us emphasize in passing that his opposition between "Platonic myth" and the "State-myth" addressed to the masses (7-8, 129) seems a little artificial, for aside from the fact that the latter are no less creations of Plato than those he calls "Platonic", a "State-myth" such as the noble lie in the Republic is not only addressed to the masses but to the philosophers as well. These myths have the function of establishing a certain political hierarchy, a certain order, a differentiated unity where philosophers play a leadership role. Everyone must be convinced of the solid foundation of this order, the philosophers as well as the rest of the citizenry. The fact that politics is not explicitly at the centre of the discussion between Socrates and Phaedrus does necessarily preclude a more political interpretation of the Phaedrus' myths. One can avoid the logical inconsistency that results from the (implicit) acceptance of the epistemological conception that Socrates presents in the myth (as though it were an adequate description of knowledge) by accentuating the political aim of this dialogue and recognizing that the Palinode has a partial function of transmitting 'useful' beliefs that are favourable to the establishment of philosophy's social authority in the city. This political reading has the advantage of being entirely compatible with the protreptic function so frequently proposed by Werner, who describes thePhaedrus a "conversion dialogue" (250). [4]

Another aspect of what I will call Werner's 'trivialisation' of dialectic concerns the assimilation that he perceives between dialectic and what Socrates describes as true rhetorical techne. Some of Werner's phrasings suggest that this true rhetoric is nothing other than dialectic.[5] But Socrates' idea seems to be subtler. Rather than a pure and simple assimilation of the two, Socrates seems to suggest instead that a rhetoric that claims to be a techne should comprise various competencies, including the dialectician's capacity to know the truth of the matter that he is trying to persuade his audience of, as well as the ability to accomplish "divisions and gatherings" (266b). Socrates' explanation, however, suggests that these capacities related to the intelligible Forms do not exhaust the aptitudes required by the expert orator insofar as the orator not only needs to know what kind of speech persuades what kind of soul but must also know how to recognize what sort of soul the person possesses that he is attempting to persuade here and now. Like a physician, the expert in psychagogy cannot content himself with theory alone. He must also be able to apply the correct speech to this particular soul (271d-272a), which requires a form of diagnostic training that does not seem to be derived from dialectic as described in 265e-66b. As important as it may be, dialectic thus seems to be only one of the competencies demanded of the psychagogue so that it would be inexact to describe the relation between true rhetorical techne and dialectic as being an "assimilation" of one to the other. Furthermore some of the concrete points of Werner's interpretation seem once more to come into conflict with his explicit, general position. Indeed, it seems inconsistent to hold on the one hand that Plato considers true rhetorical technique to be nothing other than dialectic and on the other hand that the persuasive power of Platonic myth rests on its recourse to images, the imagination, and the emotions of the listeners or readers. When he suggests that one of the reasons why Plato, as the author of the Phaedrus, uses myths is that he is aware that most people cannot be converted to philosophy through arguments (123), he seems to implicitly admit that the art of persuasion for Plato is not to be confused with dialectic. Werner's idea that the persuasive power of the Palinode is addressed especially to thymos (an element with which dialectic has nothing to do) also goes in this direction.

Here, let us note an attractive thesis that deserves much greater development. Initially, Werner devotes a great deal of energy to showing, in a rather convincing manner, that the Palinode aims to excite the thymos by using images of struggling, humiliation, honour, victory, etc. But he then refines his analysis by explaining that, given the self-driving nature of the soul, and given that the myth presents each of its three parts (symbolized in the myth by the white horse, the black horse, and the charioteer) as "agent-like" (63-65), the psychagogic effect of the Platonic myth should ideally take the form of an "intrapersonal" persuasion (65-8, 73-5). In other words, the persuasive force of the myth does not consist in pulling or pushing the soul in a quasi-mechanical way from the outside (128) and its psychagogic action does not consist in Socrates' story acting directly on Phaedrus' soul, for example, or of the Platonic dialogue on the soul of the reader. To achieve its full effect, the reader must instead use the myth as a model of self-persuasion or internal psychagogy: the soul must move itself. Plato would thus invite us to begin a sort of interior conversation by using the images of the Palinode as a model of self-transformation and to try to achieve in ourselves what the charioteer attempts to do in the myth by persuading the good horse to follow his instructions (73-75). Ultimately the myth would thus be a tool for shaping the self by the self. This suggestion is alluring but we can nevertheless ask if such a use of the myth requires a sort of delusion. Indeed, the idea of the relative autonomy of the diverse powers of the soul and possible use of the myth as a method of internal persuasion by the 'charioteer' of the soul (who uses it as a sort of carrot for the 'white horse', the thymos) seems to suggest that the soul could somehow fool itself by motivating certain parts with images in which it (the part that reasons and commands) does not really believe, insofar as it knows they are only images that it uses to 'manipulate' other parts of itself.

These critical remarks by no means call the value of Werner's book into question. This rich commentary is necessary reading for anyone interested in the Platonic use of myth, in the Phaedrus, or in the Platonic understanding of philosophy. In an age where, in academia, Plato does not enjoy the same prestige as other ancient philosophers whose writings seem 'more serious' insofar as they are less literary, Myth and Philosophy in Plato's Phaedrus has the great merit of showing how, far from discrediting Plato as a serious philosopher, the Platonic myths (those of the Phaedrus in any case) aim primarily at leading the reader towards the examined life that Socrates praises in the Apology. Far from being opposed to philosophy or attempting to replace it, Platonic myth leads us to it.

[1] The way that the fourth function is related to philosophy is less evident than the others. Werner seems to suggest that the impression of a lack of unity created by the variety of themes and the palinodic structure of the dialogue would be a way, for Plato, to force the reader to actively reflect on this unity, and that questioning after the unity of the dialogue reflects a similar task of unification that the reader must accomplish to attain self-knowledge, (see 257).

[2] Here are a few examples from a large body, which indicate the dogmatic use that Werner makes of the Palinode: "Cognitively, we are limited insofar as we can never (in this life) attain complete or adequate knowledge of the ultimate reality (the Forms); and this in turn is because philosophical thought and activity are inevitably bound up with discourse, and discourse is always at a remove from the ultimate reality" (18); "a truthful account is simply not attainable in this life" (58); " The soul is simply not the kind of thing that can be described precisely or can be known precisely" (58); " Socrates' images of the soul brings to the fore the ineliminability of the irrational in human life. Humans are not purely rational creatures, and indeed we never will be" (59); "our actions and choices do not spring from a single motivational source, but rather from several independent sources of motivation" (59); "once we remember the nature of the human soul, however, this puzzle disappears. Since the soul is irreducibly tripartite, it is not motivated solely be a love of truth or by reasons, and so would not necessarily be responsive to a set of rational arguments concerning virtue" (80); "Plato's decision to use an eschatological myth, then, is an appropriate -- and necessary -- response given the kinds of souls that we possess, and given the kinds of limitations that are inherent in our nature" (81); "By offering an eschatological myth, then, Plato not only tells a story about human nature, but also shows us that nature directly" (81).

[3] Werner brings up this objection concerning his "interpretive dogmatism" in the final pages of his book but aside from the vague and hardly convincing explanations found here, it is too little too late (269).

[4] Werner rightly insists on the protreptic function of the myth in the Phaedrus but one must also see that the protreptic and political function are not necessarily opposed. Depicting philosophy as the discipline at the top of the political hierarchy would no doubt be a further motivation for some to devote themselves to it (someone like Alcibiades comes to mind).

[5] "Dialectic simply is the best approximation of the true rhetoric" (178), "not only is dialectic the necessary precondition for the true techne of rhetoric, it is in fact the form of discourse that comes closest to actually being that techne. In other words, dialectic itself it the best approximation of the ideal rhetoric that Socrates outlines in the second half of the Phaedrus" (174).