Mythology, Madness, and Laughter: Subjectivity in German Idealism

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Markus Gabriel and Slavoj Žižek, Mythology, Madness, and Laughter: Subjectivity in German Idealism, Continuum, 2009, 202pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781441191052.

Reviewed by Espen Hammer, Temple University


Much recent work on German Idealism has been approached from a Kantian angle. It has focused on issues of rationality and normativity, ignoring or rejecting as either irrelevant or incoherent many of the features of Post-Kantian German Idealism that seem to indicate a commitment to ontology. The central contention in this slim yet programmatic volume by Markus Gabriel and Slavoj Žižek (containing individually written essays and a co-written introduction) is that the project of German Idealism -- initiated by Kant yet radicalized and, as they see it, completed by Fichte, Hegel, and especially Schelling -- was in fact deeply oriented towards a particular conception of ontology. This ontology needs to be understood, they argue, not just because it throws light on the aims of this movement as a whole, but because it contains insights that are relevant to contemporary philosophical concerns.

The text abounds with bold declarations, sweeping generalities, and promises of new beginnings:

The fetishism of quantification and of the logical form prevailing in much of contemporary philosophical discourse is characterized by a lack of reflection on its constitution. It is our aim to dismantle this lack and to argue that we are in need of a twenty-first-century Post-Kantian Idealism which would, of course, not be geographically restricted. The era of German Idealism is over, but the era of Post-Kantian Idealism has just begun (with neo-Hegelianism as its first necessary error) (14).

One may want to know what "the fetishism of quantification" or "the logical form" refers to, why neo-Hegelianism is reduced to a "necessary" error, or what it means to say that "the era of Post-Kantian Idealism has just begun" (is the beginning of this era perhaps marked by the publication of this book?), but the text offers no answers. The general sense one gets from reading this book is that the authors have been more interested in imparting a certain vision of what philosophy should look like than in patiently defending a specific claim or set of claims.

Mythology, Madness, and Laughter -- these are hardly the kinds of concepts that mainstream scholars tend to use in order to characterize German idealism. Gabriel's and Žižek's interests are not in reason and rationality, the status of transcendental arguments, the meaning of objectivity, and the like -- the kinds of issues one would normally expect to find discussed in book-length studies of the theoretical philosophies of figures such as Kant and Hegel -- but in the darker, more romantic question of that mysterious "other" which is said to precede the constitution of a field of knowledge or the knowing, reflective, and rational subject. Their favorite thinker, then, is neither Kant nor Hegel, but Schelling, in particular the late Schelling of the "positive philosophy," for whom reflection always bears a mysterious, and in his terminology "mythological," remainder: an origin that, while not a transcendent "thing" waiting to be discovered, conditions and opens up in indeterminate and contingent ways a given discursive domain or space of reasons.

Kant, they argue, initiates this movement because he realizes that what can count as objective from a human point of view must have been constituted; there is for human beings no objectivity apart from the one they stand responsible for as epistemic subjects endowed with the capacity to synthesize and judge on the basis of a priori rules. However, with his conception of an unknowable noumenal reality beyond the range of human objectivity, Kant remains mired, they suggest, in a traditional epistemic approach whose goal is to show how adequate representation of a completely mind-independent reality is possible. Although Kant is a theorist of constitution and a transcendental idealist, he fails to rid himself of the essentially realist picture of the relationship between mind and nature that he inherits from Descartes, Locke and others.

One may at this point want to ask why Gabriel and Žižek decide to rest their account exclusively on an ontological reading of Kant, according to which the unknowability of the thing-in-itself ultimately entails skepticism about knowledge as such. On the most well-known competing reading, namely the epistemic view favored by Henry Allison and others, the thing-in-itself is not a threat to human knowledge but the object of a non-discursive, non-human understanding -- what Kant calls an "intellectual intuition" -- whose purpose is to form an illuminating yet fully hypothetical contrast to human knowledge. On the epistemic view, it makes no sense to relate our knowledge to a transcendent and metaphysically real "object-domain," if by transcendent one means something outside the scope of possible human knowledge, and human thinking (when true) reaches all the way to the objects as they exist independently of the mind yet within the constituted reality of human worldhood.

According to Gabriel and Žižek, the Hegelian answer to Kant's alleged incapacity to liberate himself from representationalism and realism consists fundamentally in holding that, rather than being metaphysically real, noumenal being, or what we can take to be such being, necessarily arises from within the space of reason; thus, the task of philosophy shifts from representation to reflection, the endless struggle to create consistency and coherence, and to posit reality in contradistinction to illusion. While applauding this move, the problem with Hegel, they argue, is that, while acknowledging that reflection means incompletion, he was too tempted by the vision of "a fully determinate, all-encompassing structure" (8). The upshot of this is not simply that Hegel sought to create a fully completed system marked by perfect conceptual closure (something Kierkegaard never stopped mocking), but also that he failed to reflect on the activity of constituting itself. Trying to create a closed system, Hegel could not account for the creator.

This is the point at which all the issues that really seem to excite Gabriel and Žižek are brought into the discussion. For any discursively structured object-domain to exist, they argue, there must be an act of constitution that makes it possible. However, since the act cannot exist at the same ontological level as the objects contained in the constituted object-domain (then in that case the act would itself be constituted, begging the question of how its constitution was possible), it follows that it must belong to a higher-order ontological level. Moreover, since this higher-order level cannot be recognized as rational or meaningful (then what is rational or meaningful can only be so according to stipulations defining the first-order domain), the view then becomes, as in the late Schelling, that some sort of "unprethinkable non-ground," a pure facticity without determination, precedes being.

In Gabriel's essay, "The Mythological Being of Reflection -- An Essay on Hegel, Schelling, and the Contingency of Necessity," a number of philosophical positions are identified with this view. There is, as mentioned, first of all Schelling, whose account of mythology "denominates the brute fact of existence of a logical space, which cannot be accounted for in logical terms" (20). For Schelling, any act of reflection, of making inferences within an established space of reasons, presupposes an unavoidable mythological origin. No ontology can constitute itself; no act of constitution can constitute itself; hence the self-constitution in consciousness of which many of the German Idealists speak produces an other to itself, a remainder, that can never be objectified or indeed even be known. However, Gabriel also invokes Heidegger, Wittgenstein, Bataille, and Cavell, arguing that the constitution of any field of objectivity in which there is necessity (in, as I understand, the form of a priori validity) rests on a higher-order contingency. In Wittgenstein, for example, the facticity of life, on which language-games are supposedly based, is contingent in the sense that it could have been otherwise: there is no necessity to the way we go about doing things, no absolute grounds that dictate what we should do, making one move reasonable and the other unreasonable.

One might think that such a view generates an infinite regress in which the ontological levels will go on forever, and it is not clear (at least not to this reader) whether Gabriel sees Schelling as being committed to some sort of foundationalism or whether his Schelling accepts the potential regress. Another important question is whether this sense of contingency implies skepticism. In Gabriel it seems to give rise to a sense of vaguely amusing (hence the laughter) uneasiness: our life-form could have been different, it is just one among an infinite number of possibilities, thus any claim to objective truth within a given system of propositions seems to falter. The point is not that propositions are necessarily arbitrary, which would entail that they could not be assessed as to their reasonability. It is rather that our life-form as a whole is without grounding, and that deep, metaphysical skepticism is therefore justified. What Gabriel does not seem to recognize is that this consideration (which seems to return him to the bad Kant of the two worlds) can only be made on the basis of some kind of god's eye point of view, pretending to look at our life-form and our practices from outside. It is only from such a transcendent viewpoint that they can appear contingent. Viewed immanently we simply do what we do, and there is no possible alternative that could appear to us as intelligible; thus, ultimately, the very distinction between immanence and transcendence collapses.

In my reading, this is a central motif in Wittgenstein's On Certainty: not that we lack grounding (which would entail skepticism), but that the very question of grounding (and hence also the attribution of contingency) is misguided. There is no point of view that is external to our practices, and therefore no meaningful question of how they can be grounded. Gabriel and Žižek, however, speak of "error, illusion, misunderstanding, negativity, finitude, etc." as being "necessary preconditions for an adequate, non-objectified understanding of the absolute as the opening up of a domain within which determinate (finite) objects can appear" (5). This is confusing not only because error, illusion, and so on can, as they say, only occur within the system, but also because it seems to suggest, again in a transcendent fashion, that an absolute standard exists against which we always fall short.

In German Idealism, the issue of constitution is intimately linked to that of subjectivity. Thus, in major figures like Kant and Fichte the subject -- that is, the transcendental subject -- can be said to constitute the conditions under which objects can be objectively known. It is therefore not surprising that Gabriel's and Žižek's interest in the problem and possible paradoxes of constitution lead them to consider the status of the subject in German Idealism. Gabriel does so mainly in terms of Dieter Henrich's familiar critique of the model of reflection: the subject cannot be understood in terms of self-reflection, because self-reflection, the act by means of which the subject thinks and objectifies itself, presupposes the subject/object split and hence begs the question of how the subject comes into being.[1] Schelling, Hölderlin, and the late Fichte therefore introduce the notion of a capacity for spontaneous self-determination that precedes the level of objectification -- an "absolute indifference" that must always be presupposed, but of which we can have no discursive knowledge. Gabriel is especially interested in the late Schelling's conception of "unprethinkable Being" -- the pure facticity which is said to precede and accompany any act of constitution. The necessity of this facticity, he suggests, can only be ascertained from within the logical space of reason at which point it is felt as a lack. Again, this is obscure because the sense of a lack cannot arise at the level of objectification (which on its own terms is perfectly complete) but presupposes an implicit appeal to a standpoint outside the scope of reason altogether.

Žižek's two essays, "Discipline between Two Freedoms -- Madness and Habit in German Idealism" and "Fichte's Laughter" deal respectively with the role of habit in Hegel and certain purported paradoxes in Fichte's theory of subjectivity. Žižek's argument is clearly in line with much of his previous work, and there are plenty of references to, among others, Freud and Lacan that readers familiar with his thinking will find useful but which others may find indulgent or just simply confusing. A typical move in Žižek is to identify analogies between a present philosophical problematic and some other area of cultural production like film or psychoanalytic theory. However, analogies don't explain anything; at best they function like a good metaphor, allowing us to imaginatively redescribe a phenomenon in terms that are more interesting or satisfying than those with which we started.

According to Žižek's reading of Hegel "habit provides the background and foundation for every exercise of freedom" (101). Speech, thought, bodily action -- these are all founded, he argues, upon a layer of mindless, mechanical habit that is inculcated in us from our earliest years. In Žižek's willfully postmodern rhetoric one reads that

Perhaps, this Hegelian notion of habit allows us to account for the cinema-figure of zombies who drag themselves slowly around in a catatonic mood, but persisting forever: are they not figures of pure habit, of habit at its most elementary, prior to the rise of intelligence (of language, consciousness, and thinking)? (100)

Habit is Hegel's response to the Kantian problem of how the exercise of autonomy comes about: in some way or another the subject must be pushed into action, and autonomy, it would seem, is only attainable as the result of heteronymous subjection in the form of training and discipline. Rather than some kind of active self-presence, the subject is then essentially empty or hollow. Even our emotions are essentially learned. There is no original spontaneity, and our responses are like the "canned laughter" of the TV sitcom. Although the view itself may not be without merit, it calls for an answer (not given by Žižek) to the question why Hegel viewed autonomy as the central aspiration of human life. Why the celebration of autonomy among the German idealists when, in fact, their considered view was that we deep down are no more than zombies?

In "Fichte's Laughter," Žižek continues to reflect upon the subject, arguing that Fichte's account of Anstoß, an impetus that limits the practical activity of the I, demonstrates an awareness of an "irreducible facticity and contingency" (143) preceding the full constitution of subjectivity and reality. For Fichte, there is, he continues, "a non-assimilable foreign body in the very core of the subject" (143). Attempting to explain this notion, Žižek invokes Lacan's notion of the objet petit a, a surplus or void belonging to the order of the Real as opposed to the Symbolic. Very roughly, what Fichte has discovered is that the subject is not characterized most originally in terms of spontaneity or production. Rather, there is always a remainder: we always fail to become subjects, and this failure -- the infinite striving of which Fichte speaks -- is the subject. Infinite self-alienation is what the human condition is all about.

Although this book is somewhat uneven, it addresses a number of issues that students of German Idealism will find interesting. Behind it all lurks the monstrous question of what subjectivity really is and what its place in nature is -- and this is something no thoughtful person can fail to reflect upon.

[1] Dieter Henrich, Fichtes ursprüngliche Einsicht (Frankfurt am Main: Klostermann, 1967).