In Defense of Conciliar Christology: A Philosophical Essay

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Timothy Pawl, In Defense of Conciliar Christology: A Philosophical Essay, Oxford University Press, 2016, 251pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198765929.

Reviewed by William J. Abraham, Southern Methodist University


This volume is an outstanding contribution to the literature in Analytic Theology that has officially taken off over the last ten years or so. I shall lodge a caveat at the end, but nothing I say at that point takes away from my initial evaluation. This is work is a rigorous defense of central theological elements in the Christian tradition; it is first rate in content and execution.

Timothy Pawl's central goal is to show that the Christological claims articulated in the decisions of the Ecumenical Councils are coherent; they do not involve any contradictions. This is a bold enterprise that does not resort to an appeal to mystery, a move that one often finds in Christian theology across the centuries.

The book has three parts. The first takes up the issue of doctrine, definitions, and metaphysics. While Pawl is careful to note his potential theological limitations in articulating the Christological doctrines of the patristic period, he covers the relevant territory accurately and persuasively. In this respect his work fills a lacuna in some recent analytic theology in that he has immersed himself in the content of the relevant conciliar decisions. With this in hand, he then identifies the looming charge of incoherence. The conciliar decrees would appear to say that something can be both passible and impassible, that a single person has two wills, and that an immutable thing became incarnate. In order to tackle these seeming contradictions, he then proceeds to dig deeper by offering a rigorous account of hypostasis (also known as supposit and suppositum), person, and nature. In each case he deftly shows how his account dovetails with the work of significant figures in the history of theology. After identifying six necessary conditions that any model of the incarnation must satisfy, he then lays out his own model for satisfying these conditions before fleshing it out. He argues for a hylomorphic theory of reality, the view that truth depends on reality, and an account of essential and accidental predications.

In the second part Pawl begins by setting out as rigorously as possible the fundamental problem of incoherence that has to be addressed. His initial strategy is to state the difficulty not in terms of properties but in terms of predications. He captures the issue nicely in this formulation: "Necessarily, for every object, x and for every predicate, Q, Q and Q's complement cannot both be aptly predicated of x at the same time, in the same way." He thus deploys the familiar strategy of semantic ascent. Complementary predicates in this instance are predicates like impassible and passible, and immutable and mutable. He could have simply added, in order to capture the challenge of locating two wills in one person, the predicates having only one will and having two wills. The dilemma for the Christian theologian is that affirming the relevant complementary predicates lands her with a contradiction.

Pawl systematically and patiently works his way through possible solutions that he deems unworkable, say, by a straight appeal to mystery, by denying that the relevant predicates apply to Christ, or by denying that they apply at the same time. The first is clearly unsatisfactory for many philosophers; the second for theologians committed to the Ecumenical Councils. In the third case, Pawl turns his critical arguments against the standard kenotic Christologies that have shown up over the last two hundred years. He goes to great lengths to tackle the additional option of saying that the contradictory predicates can be shown to be compatible by noting that a formulation in terms of 'qua x but not qua y' are equally unsatisfactory. He disposes of no less than six different ways of deploying this strategy. His own preferred solution is to insist that the supposed incompatible predications simply do not hold. On this score he finds it odd that the theologians of the councils would have missed this supposedly obvious mistake: they were extremely careful to think through the issues rigorously, so hermeneutical charity requires that we initially refuse to attribute such an obvious mistake to them. This opens the door for Pawl to argue that, contrary to our initial intuitions and much of the literature on the topic, the relevant predications are not in fact incompatible. The heart of his response is to develop an account of the truth conditions, say, of 'passible' and 'impassible', which shows that they are not in fact incompatible. He rounds off this discussion by tackling the obvious objections that can be made against his position.

By this time, Pawl has essentially finished most of the heavy-lifting that goes into this volume. However, in the third part he takes up a number of additional metaphysical objections. Here he initially tackles further questions about atemporality, immutability, and impassibility. He also attends to the issue made famous by Maximus the Confessor as to whether we should think of Christ has having two wills rather than one will.

This volume, let me repeat, represents an outstanding contribution to analytic theology; it rightly belongs in a new series devoted to this enterprise. The subtitle signals the kind of analytic theology it represents; the book is "A Philosophical Essay". We should not waste time at this point on verbal disputes about differences between philosophy or religion, philosophical theology, and analytic theology. The features that make this book a contribution to analytic theology are obvious. First, it involves extensive engagement with the decisions of the Ecumenical Councils in Christology. Second, it involves interaction with the theologians who helped work out and defend the relevant conciliar decisions. Third, it picks up and extends their work by tackling the objections that these theologians felt obliged to respond to as an essential part of their vocation. In other words, they made forays into apologetic theology that were crucial for sustaining of the conciliar commitments in Christology. It was not as though the Church said it and that settles it, so we believe it. Theologians recognized that they had to defend the decisions already made by the Church. Moreover, to do so, they could not avoid engaging in extremely complex metaphysical inquiry. Rigorous work in conceptual analysis, in logic, and in metaphysics was inescapable.

Pawl stands squarely in this tradition of theological inquiry. Thus we might rightly identify his work as belonging to what we might call the precisionist wing of analytic theology. Some non-analytic theologians are prone to resist this kind of analytic theology and then go on to write off the whole enterprise. This is surely a mistake. The fundamental problem of incoherence related to the Incarnation has long been noted within Christian theology; theologians should welcome any and every effort to address it. To be sure, this will require technical skill in logic and metaphysics that can be boring in the extreme. A parallel problem exists in dealing with issues in the epistemology of theology. George Orwell once tried to read Bertrand Russell's work on the nature of knowledge and gave up; he noted privately that philosophy should be forbidden by law. I suspect that some theologians would be tempted to follow his prescription. However, neither epistemology nor metaphysics can be disposed of so easily once one takes seriously both the content and history of Christian theology.

Moreover, reading Pawl can help any theologian come to terms with crucial concepts that are inescapable in theology, such as immutability, impassibility, and atemporality. Hence there is good reason to work through a volume like this even though the rigorous technical details may prove to be daunting and intimidating. The work of philosophy is to get a good reading of the relevant history. Pawl is also helpful in drawing attention to the logical and metaphysical proposals that show up in the history of theology but that can easily be missed because they are not immediately visible. He also deftly shows the difficulties that crop up, say, in kenotic Christologies, or in the appeal to mystery.

Having said all that -- and here comes my caveat -- it would be a mistake to limit analytic theology to the precisionist kind on display in such abundance in this volume. The internal content and method of philosophy, including analytic philosophy, are contested. Consider the extended use of parable across the years within the philosophy of religion. It is simply not the case that everything we say in philosophy has to be in terms of precise concepts and deductive arguments. Analogies, metaphors, and parables cannot be dismissed as epiphenomena. This constraint would not, for example, get us very far in dealing with the philosophical issues that arise in the meaning and practice of liturgy. Moreover, one can develop genres in analytic theology that are much more accessible to the general reader and are exceptionally illuminating even though they do not come decked out in the form and style that is deployed by Pawl and many others. This has been the case long before the recent phase of analytic theology came into existence. There is no need to limit ourselves in analytic theology to the precisionist mode championed by some in the field. However, there are some issues that absolutely require precisely the kind of precisionist work that constitute the heart of this volume. Those not drawn to this vision of analytic theology, or not equipped to deliver it, have much to learn from this meaty and rigorous volume.