In Defense of Extended Conciliar Christology: A Philosophical Essay

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Timothy Pawl, In Defense of Extended Conciliar Christology: A Philosophical Essay, Oxford University Press, 2019, 250pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198834144.

Reviewed by Gaven Kerr, St Patrick's College, Maynooth


The purpose of this book is to consider extensions to the conciliar Christology that Timothy Pawl defended in his previous book, In Defense of Conciliar Christology (OUP, 2016). Pawl sets out five extensions that he wishes to consider as contradictory or otherwise to conciliar Christology: the possibility of multiple incarnations, Christ's sojourn in hell, the freedom of Christ's will, Christ's impeccability, and the extent of Christ's human knowledge of things past, present, and future.

In Chapter 1, Pawl lays out what he takes to be the distinctive claims of conciliar Christology. For him this is the view that in Christ there was: (i) one person, i.e., the Word, (ii) a divine nature, (iii) a human nature, which natures are (iv) united without confusion, and (v) the predicates proper to one nature as predicated of the person can be applied to the other nature as applied to the person, i.e., the communicatio idiomatum. In the remainder of the chapter Pawl goes into some technical metaphysical issues pertaining to how we should understand these commitments. Following this chapter, Pawl proceeds to consider the extensions to these conciliar commitments and whether the extensions outlined above conflict with them. His considered view is that they do not.

Chapters 2 and 3 address the possibility of multiple incarnations and whether Aquinas's strong position in this respect is consistent with conciliar Christology. Chapter 2 outlines what Pawl takes to be Aquinas's position here such that there could be three simultaneously existing concrete rational natures each of which is assumed by all three persons of the Trinity at the same time. Chapter 3 then considers seven objections to this position in light of conciliar Christology.

The first is that given the communicatio idiomatum predications true of one nature transfer to the other, in which case, should the Word assume several different natures, then one thing can be true of one nature which is false of another, yet both transfer to the person of the Word and so we have the joint affirmation of a truth and its complementary falsehood. Pawl's resolution of this problem is the traditional one of qualifying the predication such that God is born, suffers, and dies qua His human nature, but not qua His divine nature. Mutatis mutandis, then, the same goes for multiple incarnations the assumed natures of which display contradictory predicates.

The second objection is that if multiple divine persons could assume a single human nature, that human nature would have too many centres of intelligence. Pawl's response is that in this case we would have exactly the right number of thinkers: one thinker for every divine person that assumes the nature, and so there is no problem.

The third objection is that were a divine person to assume several distinct natures then that divine person would be dispersed over a community of natures all existing together in the eschaton. Pawl's response is to point out that in the incarnation (of a single or multiple nature) the nature assumed is not a person; hence if there were several assumed natures, there would not be several persons, so there wouldn't be a community of (assumed) persons existing in the eschaton in which the divine person subsists; rather there would be several natures all assumed by the divine person.

The fourth objection is that one divine person could only assume one nature, otherwise there would be a split personality. Pawl's response is that the assumed nature does not confer personality on the person Who assumes the nature, since it is not a person that is assumed, in which case there is no threat to the unity of the divine person assuming several natures.

The fifth objection is that in assuming a nature the divine person confers His personality on that nature, but since the divine person is one, any nature that that person assumed will have that single personality conferred on it. This must mean that any assumed nature has the individuality of the divine person, in which case there can only be one nature assumed. Pawl's response is that it is not the divine person that individuates the nature assumed; rather we can follow a Thomistic approach to the effect that the individuating factor for the assumed nature is its matter, in which case the individuation of the nature is not the result of the individuality of the person assuming it.

The sixth objection is that given the scriptural evidence, it is unfitting that the Father and Holy Spirit become incarnate. Pawl's response is that it is a mistake to confuse what God has done with what God can do. So, granted that God the Son became incarnate, this does not mean that the Father and the Holy Spirit could not also become incarnate.

The final objection, then, is that only the Son could become incarnate because only the Son is the image of God and so can represent that image to creation. Pawl argues that this objection suffers the same fate as the previous, viz., that simply because this is how God has acted, it does not entail that it captures exhaustively how God could act. Given these objections and the responses, Pawl concludes that a commitment to multiple incarnations such as is found in Aquinas is not inconsistent with conciliar Christology.

Chapter 4 deals with the identity of Christ's human nature after his death but before the resurrection. If it is essential to having a human nature that body and soul are united such that at the sundering of body and soul there is a loss of the human nature, then at his death Christ's human nature was lost. But this stands in tension with the Christological view that, once assumed, the human nature remains permanently assumed by the Word. Pawl argues that from the viewpoint of the Word the whole human nature (body and soul) is assumed in the incarnation, but from the viewpoint of the components, it is the parts that are assumed and united to the Word. In that case, and as opposed to the case of a non-divine person, the parts assumed remained united to the divine person even when they are not united with each other. And since the assumption of a human nature is the assumption of the parts of that nature, and the parts are never sundered from the divine person, it remains true that the nature is assumed by the divine person even after death.

Chapters 5 and 6 deal with volitional extensions to conciliar Christology, so focus on issues pertaining to Christ's will. Chapter 5 deals with the freedom of Christ's human will whereas Chapter 6 deals with Christ's impeccability.

In Chapter 5, Pawl explains that conciliar Christology is committed to there being two wills in Christ, one human and the other divine. There is a unity in these wills such that the human will is in agreement with and subordinated to the divine. This, however, raises a problem for the freedom of Christ's human will. Pawl points out that in Christ there is one person with two wills, whereas in typical cases undermining freedom, there is one person curtailing the freedom of another; so, there is a significant disanalogy here. Not only that, if it is only wills that are free, it does not appear to be a problem for one will that is free to be in conformity with another.

In Chapter 6, Pawl notes that Christ was tempted, yet he was like us in all things but sin; temptation and freedom from sin seem to be in tension. In considering this, Pawl presents an account of temptation the giving in to which is not obviously sinful, e.g., if one has undertaken independently of any vow not to eat something, but gives into temptation and eats it, it is not clear that such temptation is sinful. Similarly, for Christ, he can have temptations which temptations themselves do not involve the ability to sin. Turning to Christ's impeccability, Pawl argues (surprisingly) that in a certain sense Christ can be peccable. This is due to Pawl's definition of peccability, according to which something is peccable if it has a concrete nature for which it is possible that someone sin by means of it. Hence, were Christ's human nature, per impossibile, to be severed from the hypostatic union, it would follow that that human nature would be the nature of a human person, and that that person could sin with it. Of course, Christ's human nature is assumed by the Word, which is impeccable, so in this instance the nature as assumed is also impeccable.

Chapters 7 and 8 consider Christ's knowledge in relation to freedom of the will. Chapter 7 considers these issues in relation to creaturely freedom, and Chapter 8 considers them in relation to Christ's freedom.

Problems of divine foreknowledge and human freedom are well known. If God knows all things, past, present, and future, how is it that we can be free in any future action? The typical Thomist response is to emphasise God's eternity, to the effect that God does not in the past have a knowledge of what a free agent will do in the future. Rather, all moments of time are present to God in His eternity, so that no moment of time is past or future for God. And just as the knowledge that a present knower has of a free agent's action does not threaten the freedom of that action, neither does God's knowledge in the eternal present. So far so good, but Pawl presents a unique problem in Chapter 7. Christ's human intellect can know all that God knows by the knowledge of vision, i.e., God's knowledge of what was, is, and will be. But this knowledge of all things past, present, and future was possessed by a human intellect just over 2000 years ago, in which case the human intellect of Christ, not occupying the eternal present, has knowledge of all things past, present, and future, and this does seem to threaten future free actions. In response Pawl stresses that Christ's human knowledge is the same in kind as that possessed by all other humans, and so is based on the reality of things in the world; hence his knowledge of future things will be based on what will happen. However, how Christ attains this knowledge need not be the same as that of other humans, since Christ's human intellect can be divinely illuminated to know all things past, present, and future. And if that is the case then, even though Christ's human intellect does not occupy an eternal present, it is yet illuminated to know all things past, present, and future by an intellect which does occupy an eternal present, in which case the Thomist solution follows.

Finally, in Chapter 8 Pawl considers a problem for Christ's foreknowledge and his own human freedom. This problem is manifested in two ways: (i) if Christ foreknows what he will and will not do, then he cannot deliberate and hence cannot be free. In response, Pawl denies that freedom per se requires deliberation. This is because deliberation is only required for those who are ignorant of the true good in some situation, in which case they must deliberate over what to do. But for someone (such as Christ) who knows exactly the true good in any situation, there is no need to deliberate over what choice to make, the choice of which good to choose is manifest. (ii) Christ's foreknowledge explains his future choices, and yet his future choices explain his foreknowledge; for he foreknows what he will do given that he will do it, and he does what he will do given that he knows he will do it. Hence, we have an explanatory circle. In response Pawl argues that we avoid circularity if we distinguish between the kinds of explanatory priority involved. On the one hand we have motivational priority, such that Christ's foreknowledge that he will do X is explanatorily prior to his doing X insofar as it motivates him to do it. On the other hand we have a kind of truthmaker priority, such that Christ's doing X is prior to his foreknowledge of his doing X insofar as he knows only that he will do X if (at some point) he will do X. Insofar as there are different kinds of explanatory priority here, it is not the case that in the same respect the foreknowledge is explanatorily prior to the action and the action is explanatorily prior to the foreknowledge; hence a circle is avoided.

All in all this is an excellent book, and I highly recommend it for anyone interested in Conciliar Christology approached from a systematically philosophical perspective. Many who are interested in Thomism and scholasticism more generally will benefit from this book. I want to emphasise that point -- this is an excellent book.

Having said that it does raise an issue for me, an issue not isolated to the book and so not a failing of the book itself. Pawl clearly situates his book within the analytic theology movement, and he is certainly a master of this style of philosophy/theology. However, one wonders, with that in mind, just how much we are engaged in the same sort of philosophical/theological project as Aquinas (or Albert or Scotus). Let me take a few examples from the book. During the course of argumentation, Pawl is willing to grant the truth of several premises to his opponent so as to argue that even granting such, his opponent's position does not establish the inconsistency of Conciliar Christology with the particular extension in question. Now, no doubt the scholastics did engage in such argumentative manoeuvres, but beyond that their primary goal was establishing the truth of a particular thesis in question. Hence, whilst one will find Aquinas granting his opponent's premise to show that even then his opponent's position does not follow, Aquinas moves on to the bigger issue of considering whether the disputed premise is true. And it is the latter kind of reasoning that I fear is downplayed in analytic theology in favour of making use of some argumentative device to show that an opponent's position doesn't follow.

I don't want the latter to undermine the many excellent points in Pawl's book. Those who think that analytic philosophy is a poor bedfellow for Aquinas or any other scholastic will certainly have issues in general with a work in analytic theology. When it comes to specifics, I think the book is well written, illuminating, and offers a pathway into thinking about Christological issues from a robustly philosophical perspective. I am pleased to have read it and I thoroughly recommend it.