Naked: The Dark Side of Shame and Moral Life

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Krista K. Thomason, Naked: The Dark Side of Shame and Moral Life, Oxford University Press, 2018, 236 pp., $85.00, ISBN 9780190843274.

Reviewed by Carissa Véliz, University of Oxford


This book is a worthwhile read for anyone interested in shame and its role in morality. It is particularly timely given how common public shaming has become in online settings. Krista K. Thomas argues that, even though shame is a negative emotion with potentially damaging consequences, its dark side is outweighed by its moral benefits insofar as shame is constitutive of desirable moral commitments. According to her, being liable to shame is constitutive of respecting other people's points of view, acknowledging others' moral standing, and accepting that our identities are not only set by what we think of ourselves, but also by factors outside of our control that include our personal histories and other people's opinions of us.

Chapter 1 introduces three philosophical positions on shame: the traditional, the naturalistic, and the pessimistic views. What Thomason calls the traditional view of shame presents shame as the result of realising one has failed to live up to one's ideals. While this view can account satisfactorily for moral instances of shame (e.g. feeling shame about having done something wrong), Thomason argues that it fails to provide a convincing account of some of the most paradigmatic, yet non-moral cases of shame (for example, a boy caught masturbating). The naturalistic view sees shame as the result of not behaving in accordance with public norms and standards. In describing shame's role as incentivising social conformity, it does a better job than the traditional view of accounting for non-moral instances of shame. On the downside, this view lacks a normative stance: it tells us nothing about whether and when shame might be an appropriate response. Finally, the pessimistic view of shame argues that shame is a negative emotion that ought to be overcome. Thomason's ultimate objective will be to argue that shame is morally necessary, and not something to get rid of.

In Chapter 2 Thomason examines the connection between shame and violence. When faced with feeling shame, or with the threat of feeling shame, people sometimes resort to aggression and violence. She argues that neither the naturalistic nor the traditional view can explain this phenomenon. The naturalistic view cannot explain violence in response to shame because it goes against its main argument: that shame is a way for people to show appeasement to dominance. Similarly, the traditional view cannot explain why someone would respond to shame by doing something even worse than failing to live up to an ideal. Thomason argues that a better way to interpret the connection between shame and violence is to think about violence as a reaction to a lack of control in relation to an unflattering part of our identity that we "do not embrace or identify with" (pp.74-75). Thomason further elucidates why shame can turn into violence in the following chapter.

Readers interested in Thomason's original account of shame can skip the first two chapters, which can be seen as an extensive prolegomenon. In Chapter 3, Thomason offers her account of privacy, arguing that shame is an experience of tension between one's identity (who we are, which is partly determined by features of our histories and by how others see us) and one's self-conception (who we think we are). When we feel shame, we feel defined by some feature of our identity that overshadows our self-conception; we suddenly feel like we are nothing other than what we feel shame about.

Thomason's account of shame is original and appealing. It gives a satisfactory explanation of the phenomenology of shame, and does a good job of explaining the link between violence and shame: shame makes us feel powerless because it makes us feel defined by an aspect of ourselves we do not wish to be defined by, and violence is an act of self-assertion that helps us feel empowered, more like agents and less like passive victims of others' judgments.

Thomason's account can also explain difficult cases that other accounts struggle with: feeling shame when being the recipient of positive attitudes, feeling shame about others' misdeeds or flaws, and feeling shame about one's physical features. On Thomason's view, when Schindler is faced with the gratitude of people whose lives he saved, he feels shame because, in his modesty, he does not feel like a hero. Schindler feels "unworthy" of praise because "the image that others have of him feels false from his own point of view" (pp.105-106). Likewise, we are capable of feeling ashamed of our families, whose behaviour we do not control, because they are people we acknowledge as being part of our identities (p.107). When we feel shame about our physical features -- a crooked nose, for instance -- we feel that it defines us, that it is what others will judge us by (p.110).

A trickier case is that of the shame felt by victims of rape. Following the work of Susan Brison, Thomason argues that the shame felt by rape survivors can be understood as an attempt to "regain power or control" (p.122). Shame would be a kind of defence mechanism; by accepting at least some degree of responsibility for what happened through feeling shame, the victim feels less powerless: "even though blaming yourself feels bad, it feels better to do that when your other option is simply to feel powerless" (p.122). But this interpretation does not seem to fit her account. First, it assumes that feeling shame is associated with feeling responsible, when at other parts Thomason has been successful in showing that shame can be felt about things that are beyond our control and responsibility (for example, a crooked nose). Second and more importantly, this description seems to speak against her explanation of violence. On the one hand, she contends that people who feel shame may behave violently as a remedy to the feelings of powerlessness attached to shame. On the other hand, she says that victims of rape feel empowered by shame through the attached feeling of self-blame and responsibility. It is not clear how shame can have the opposite effects of sometimes making people feel disempowered (passive) and other times making them feel empowered (agents). However, it is also not clear that Thomason needs shame to have those contrary effects for her theory to work; victims' shame could be the result of feeling eclipsed or overly defined by the rape they suffered.

A further advantage of Thomason's account is that it does not need to divide shame into moral and non-moral types, which makes for a simpler model. Her view, nonetheless, seems more similar to the traditional view than one might have expected. "Instead of feeling shame because we fail to live up to our values," Thomason writes, "we feel shame because our actions, judgments, or feelings do not match up with the way we represent our moral character to ourselves" (p.116). It could be argued, however, that the way we represent our moral character to ourselves is very closely related to our ideals and values. If one thinks of oneself as a good person, or an honest person, that ideal is at least partly constituted by values. Furthermore, our self-conceptions are often more normative than Thomason's description might lead us to think. Someone who has low self-esteem and considers herself to be a bad person can presumably still feel shame when confronted with a misdeed of hers. Such shame might be felt, not because there is a mismatch between her misdeed and the way she sees her moral character, but because there is a mismatch between her misdeed and the person she would like to be, or she thinks she could be or ought to be. Thus, it looks like our self-conception might be at least partly constituted by our ideals and values.

In Chapter 4, Thomason argues against the pessimistic view and contends that shame is a morally valuable emotion. She first acknowledges the dark side of shame, including how it can cause both violent and self-destructive behaviour (p.131). She then goes on to point out that, despite shame's danger, shamelessness is typically considered a vice. On her account, shamelessness is bad because "it is a failure to entertain other points of view about who we are" (p.151). The shameless person is impervious to others' criticisms. If one is not liable to shame, the authority of one's self-conception is never doubted or challenged. Emotions, Thomason argues, are ways of recognising the authority of others. What we feel says something about what we think and the kind of person we are. Susceptibility to grief, for example, expresses the depth of our feelings for others (p.147). Similarly, "liability to shame is partially constitutive of our respect for others as moral agents" (p.155).

While I find Thomason's view thought-provoking, I remain unconvinced. Shame might be sufficient to show that someone is willing to entertain others' views, but that does not make it a necessary condition to respect others. It is perfectly imaginable that someone might be responsive to others' criticisms without feeling shame. Thomason believes that the "same features of moral psychology give rise to both respect and to shame" (p.157) and endorses Rawls's view that our emotions are interconnected in such a way that, if we were to get rid of one emotion, the rest would be "disfigured" (p.147). But no evidence is offered in support of this claim. Even if it were true that changing one emotion would change others, perhaps getting rid of shame would rid us of other undesirable emotions and commitments, rather than desirable ones. For a book on a topic in moral psychology, it is slightly thin on empirical evidence.

For shame to be necessary for being good moral agents, it has to be irreplaceable. Thomason, however, is not successful in showing that liability to guilt or regret would not be enough for people to acknowledge others' views. Against guilt, she argues that it can be just as consuming as shame (p.162), and that, because guilt is an emotion that is directed at our actions and not our identities, it can lead people to adopt an "overly narrow" view of themselves (not accepting that our identities are partly made up of elements beyond our control), which Thomason thinks of as "morally immature" (p.164). One advantage of guilt over shame, however, is that it focuses on the harm done; it thus typically looks to victims (Williams 1993, 93), and is connected to remorse, regret, and reparation (Nussbaum 2004, 208, Fessler 2004).

The person who is feeling shame is in pain about herself; shame is a self-centred emotion. But morality is arguably more about concerning oneself with others' interests and needs, with others' emotions, rather than one's own. Thomason argues that critics of shame make the mistake of equating "a virtuous moral psychology with a positive moral psychology," and that we do not have to "feel good in order to be good" (8). Evidence suggests, however, that positive moods lead to prosocial behaviour (Carlson, Charlin, and Miller 1988), while self-centred negative emotions like personal distress detract from it (Eisenberg et al. 1994). It is easier to be good when one feels good.

Thomason admits that if we were to find someone who was able to recognise other points of view and the limits of her self-conception without being liable to shame, her theory would be falsified, as it would show that shame is not constitutive of those commitments (p.166). Readers' experiences will surely vary in this respect, but anecdotally, I can think of at least one person I know well who reports not feeling shame, in whom I have never seen symptoms of shame, and who is nonetheless clearly open to taking other people's criticisms seriously and admitting mistakes and flaws. Perhaps Thomason could argue that even if someone has felt no shame in a long time, they might still be liable to feeling shame in the right circumstances. Maybe more would need to be said about what those circumstances might be, although Thomason argues that shame has no appropriateness conditions on account of it being an emotion that refers to how we experience ourselves and not the world (pp.170-171). In any case, while a personal anecdote is surely not enough to refute Thomason's argument, it does suggest that whether someone can recognise others' moral standing without feeling shame is an empirical question that can be tested and cannot be entirely decided from the armchair.

Chapter 5 explores the morality of invitations to shame (privately nudging someone into self-awareness), shaming (holding up misdeeds or flaws for public scorn), and stigmatising (shaming someone into a marginalised group). Thomason argues that invitations to shame are morally acceptable in moral self-defence cases (p.190), but that shaming and stigmatising are unjustified on the grounds that attempting to define another person's identity in social life is "an illegitimate exercise of power over another moral agent" (13). People who shame refuse to acknowledge the self-conception of the shamed person; therefore, for Thomason, shaming is as unjustifiable as shamelessness, given that both involve ignoring others' points of view.

This book is undoubtedly a valuable contribution to furthering the conversation about shame and its proper place in morality. Thomason's account of the nature of shame is alluring and deserves serious consideration. The jury is still out about whether shame is a desirable emotion, however. Thomason's bet is for it. Mine is against it. Philosophers seeking to better inform their own bets would do well in reading this book.


Carlson, M., V. Charlin, and N. Miller. 1988. "Positive mood and helping behavior: a test of six hypotheses." J Pers Soc Psychol 55 (2):211-29.

Eisenberg, N., R. A. Fabes, B. Murphy, M. Karbon, P. Maszk, M. Smith, C. O'Boyle, and K. Suh. 1994. "The relations of emotionality and regulation to dispositional and situational empathy-related responding." J Pers Soc Psychol 66 (4):776-97.

Fessler, Daniel M.T. 2004. "Shame in two cultures: implications for evolutionary approaches." Journal of Cognition and Culture 4.2:207-262.

Nussbaum, Martha. 2004. Hiding from Humanity: Disgust, Shame, and the Law. Princeton University Press.

Williams, Bernard. 1993. Shame and Necessity. University of California Press.