Naming and Indexicality

Naming And Indexicality

Reviewed by Tadeusz Ciecierski, University of Warsaw


In 2022, five decades will have passed since the first publication of Saul Kripke’s Naming and Necessity and the beginning of the referentialist revolution regarding proper names and natural kind terms. The publication of Gregory Bochner’s book fits perfectly with this anniversary. On the one hand, it contains an excellent critical overview of the most important contemporary debates regarding proper names; on the other, it offers a presentation and defense of an original account of proper names—metasyntactic two-dimensionalism. This book is published in the Key Topics in Semantics and Pragmatics series, which aims to combine exposition with original philosophical contributions, so as to attract those interested in an introduction to a particular topic as well as those who are subject matter experts. It realizes this aim in an exemplary manner.

I shall divide this review into three parts, starting with an overview of the content of the book, then a few words about its expository parts, and finally a brief discussion on the idea of metasyntactic two-dimensionalism. 

  1. Overview of the content

The book consists of five chapters. The first chapter introduces the basic idea of Millianism and discusses classical descriptivist counterproposals attributed to Gottlob Frege and Bertrand Russell. Bochner characterizes linguistic content descriptivism (which he contrasts with mental descriptivism that accounts for singular thoughts) as a claim that links the determination of reference, truth-conditional contribution, cognitive value, and linguistic meaning. A descriptive mode of presentation is part of the linguistic meaning of a proper name; it determines the reference of a proper name, and it constitutes its cognitive value and truth-conditional import.

The second chapter contains an overview of the classical referentialist theories of Kripke, Hilary Putnam, and David Kaplan. This chapter goes beyond the case of proper names and discusses natural kind terms and indexicals. This is justified, however, as it facilitates an introduction to the ideas of externalism, internalism, direct reference, and the crucial concepts of Kaplanian semantics, which are used later in the book. In this chapter, Bochner also follows the traditional path of introducing and distinguishing between modal, semantic, and epistemic arguments against descriptivism. The arguments are consistently used in the subsequent chapters to test various theories of meaning and reference for proper names.

The third chapter connects Boghossian's principle of transparency of mental content with co-reference and no-reference puzzles, and with the analysis of content in terms of possible worlds. Bochner argues that referentialism imposes on its proponents a requirement of providing an explanation of cases of modal illusions of contingency, necessity, and contentfullness. 

The fourth chapter introduces various notions of rigidity. Bochner carefully discusses several versions of descriptivism and argues that none is satisfactory: all are refuted by modal, semantic, or epistemic arguments. He concludes that names are neither descriptions nor indexical expressions and are indeed Millian. This argument, however, leaves Fregean cognitive puzzles and modal illusions unexplained. The situation points to the need for a theoretical solution that reconciles referentialism with the explanations of these puzzles and modal illusions. The solution turns out to be a theory that postulates two aspects of content framed in the form of two-dimensional semantics.

The fifth chapter discusses various interpretations of two-dimensionalism. A critical analysis shows the inadequacy of all of them except the metasyntactic interpretation. The presentation and defense of the metasyntactic interpretation concludes this chapter and the book. The book closes with a useful glossary.

  1. Descriptive part of the book

This book appears in a series which  requires it  to provide a full critical exposition of various theories of proper names. This goal is achieved by Bochner in an exemplary manner. The discussion is always detailed and supplemented with definitions of key terms and concepts. At many points in the book, the reader expects Bochner to draw attention to a particular problem or issue, and the author—a few pages later—fulfills these expectations. The author's excellent orientation within the vast literature of the subject is admirable. Without the slightest doubt, this book can be recommended as an excellent textbook and introduction to contemporary discussions of proper names. It can also be very helpful as a synthesis of contemporary views on proper names.

Considering the richness of the themes undertaken in the book, it is not surprising that some minor inaccuracies or surprising opinions might be found while reading it. For instance, Bochner follows a popular but incorrect interpretation of the Carnapian concept of intension as being an interpretation of the Fregean notion of sense (26). In fact, Rudolf Carnap (1947) himself devoted an entire chapter of Meaning and Necessity to stressing the differences between his and Frege’s semantical theories (ibidem, Ch.III). The notion of aprioricity is also used in a surprising manner at some points in the book. It is said, for instance, that the fact that we must perform a calculation in order to establish if the square root of 1,369 is the cubic root of 50,563 justifies that the corresponding identity statement is a posteriori (79). I must admit that I do not know what concept of the a priori is at play here, but it is very unusual and would result in treating most claims of pure logic and mathematics as a posteriori. 

A slightly more important issue concerns one of the assumptions of the book, which presupposes a possible worlds analysis of the notion of content. Bochner explicitly indicates that he is not going to argue in support of this assumption (6). This is justified; however, it sometimes seems that this assumption is solely responsible for problems and also that it supports views that can be easily explained away within alternative frameworks. I think this should be stressed more emphatically. One example concerns the exclusion of possibilities or the informativeness of a problem pertaining to necessary propositions (77).[1] A possible world account of content simply has no capacity to handle this  problem, because it treats all necessary equivalent propositions as identical. Nowhere within a possible world account of content, however, is it assumed that aposterioricity and apriopricity must be described in terms of the exclusion of possibilities. In fact, on any account that detaches necessity and aprioricity, we cannot model the latter notion on differences in possibilities with respect to which we judge sentences or utterances as true or false.

Meanwhile, other accounts of content might explain the differences in the informativeness of necessarily equivalent propositions in terms of, for instance, the structure of content. The exclusion of possibilities problem is, therefore, a byproduct of a possible world account of content extended to cover epistemic notions such as aposterioricity. The problem of illusions of contingency is, therefore, an independent issue that is not driven by the exclusion of possibilities problem.

On some occasions, Bochner surprisingly forgets about his commitment to a possible world analysis of content and highlights problems that are explained away within the framework in question. For example, Bochner attempts to highlight problems with the thesis that intension determines extension (52–53). The determination in question, however, is a simple consequence of how the notion of extension is characterized. In possible worlds semantics, and all its variants, the extension is always relativized to possible worlds (or circumstances of evaluation in general), while intensions are simply totalities of such relativized extensions. A change with respect to a single relativized extension results in a change of the totality that contains it. This is the entire content of the intension-extension determination thesis. The only way to question the determination thesis is to redefine the notions of intension and extension, but one must be careful here as that would not be a criticism of the original thesis but rather a formulation of an alternative semantic framework.

Last but not least, Bochner claims that there is no need to invoke singular propositions in the definition of direct reference (102). Here is Bochner’s singular proposition-free definition of the concept:

A singular term as used in some particular context c is a directly referential designator of an object x, if and only if, (i) the character of t together with relevant facts in c determines x as the referent of t in c, (ii) in virtue of the fact that x is the referent of t in c, x is determined in advance, for any circumstance of evaluation w, to be the extension of t at w, regardless of the facts obtaining in w.

This definition, however, cannot capture the entire difference between rigidity and direct reference, at least if one wants to claim that “(the x)(x + 2 = 4)” (or: “(the x)(Actually(x + 2 = 4))” if one wants to have an indexical element embedded in the description)  is rigid but not directly referential (as Kaplan stresses). “(the x)(x + 2 = 4)” satisfies this definition as the number 2 is determined as the referent of “(the x)(x + 2 = 4)” in c for any circumstance of evaluation w. The definition, therefore, does not capture the difference between direct reference and strong metaphysical (obstinate) rigidity that involves reference regardless of the facts obtaining in w. The point is that for objects such as numbers we can easily construct descriptions that are insensitive to facts in general and which are referentially fixed once and for all. The definition of direct reference without singular propositions must also provide us with the resources to semantically explicate the idea of “determination in advance” for such cases. This does not mean that Bochner is incorrect in his claim that a definition of rigidity without singular propositions is possible; however, his definition does not provide an illustration of the eventuality in question.

These are minor and secondary issues, however, that have no impact on the overall presentation and argumentation.

  1. The metasyntactic interpretation of two-dimensionalism

By eliminating and assessing alternative views Bochner arrives at metasyntactic or presemantic two-dimensionalism (P2D henceforth).[2] His main argument for the view follows a familiar route—the view is offered as having all the benefits of referentialism combined with resources capable of explaining cognitive puzzles and modal illusions.

Here are the main claims of P2D, which can be decoded from the text:

[T1] Cognitive values are attributes of utterances or tokens.

[T2] Each utterance containing proper names might be associated with two types of contents: Millian or referential content and psychological content.

[T3] The psychological content is responsible for cognitive values and cognitive differences associated with various utterances containing proper names.

[T4] The psychological content is partially descriptive and metasyntactic/presemantic, i.e., it involves a non-rigid description of the token of a particular name that has the following form: “being a name with a shape (…) for (---)” where “(…)” ranges over the shapes or forms of names and “(---)” ranges over descriptions associated with the name by particular speakers.

[T5] The psychological content is not wholly descriptive as the description of the token might be empty, so psychological content does not determine which name particular speakers use.

[T6] The psychological content, therefore, determines potentially different name tokens in different scenarios (each depending on the ways the linguistic and non-linguistic facts turn out to be) but, at the same time, prevents tokens from having an arbitrary meaning as each is associated (across possible scenarios by a particular speaker) with a single description.

I interpret P2D as a theory that is not a variant of pluripropositionalism: the view that some utterance might (on some or all occasions) express several propositions without being ambiguous. It is rather a view that utterances express single propositions and convey single (but) complex thoughts that have a metasyntactically descriptive aspect or component.

How are cognitive puzzles explained within P2D? A particular utterance of “Hesperus is Phosphorus” might be associated (for a particular speaker or interpreter) with two metasyntactic predicates (and descriptions employing such predicates). For instance:

(D1) being a name with a shape /Hesperus/ for the shiniest celestial body to appear in the evening sky.

(D2) being a name with a shape /Phosphorus/ for the shiniest celestial body to appear in the morning sky.           

And the speaker or interpreter might simply be ignorant of the fact that the two tokens stand for the same object. Gaining such knowledge is obviously an empirical matter. In the case of contingent a priori statements we might also consider predicates such as:

(D3) being a name with a shape /Julius/ for the man who invented the zipper.

Then contrast two cases: one in which the speaker or interpreter knows that the name “Julius” has been introduced descriptively and the other in which the speaker or interpreter lacks such knowledge. In the former case, but not in the latter, the speaker or interpreter can infer, based on the stipulation she is aware of, that no matter who the referent of “Julius” is, the utterance  “Julius invented the zipper” is true. 

Finally, consider the statement “Santa Claus exists.” Bochner claims that “Santa Claus” is not a name at all but just an illusion of a name. However, he does not want to say that speakers or interpreters who use sentences containing “Santa Claus” have only illusions of thought. On the metasyntactic account, the respective thoughts are thoughts about counterfactual languages that we stipulate to contain a name of the form /Santa Claus/ which is, however, due to its distinct referential profile, not our name “Santa Claus.” As Bochner (244) nicely puts it, “empty names are possible names considered as actual.”

Bochner stresses, as one of the consequences of the metasyntactic view, that ordinary speakers cannot distinguish between languages that differ broadly and referentially but are descriptively or qualitatively indistinguishable. This further supports the general idea behind the explanation of cognitive puzzles and cases of modal illusions in terms of confusion arising from the indiscernibility in question.  

The metasyntactic account of names is an interesting and original philosophical position that deserves broader philosophical attention. However, I would like to close this review by highlighting an issue that seems to be either a challenge to P2D or an opportunity which, when addressed, might help reveal the scope and merits of the theory. As I have indicated above, in his treatment of empty terms such as “Santa Claus,” Bochner assumes that empty names are illusions of names, which might be interpreted in two different manners:

The illusion of a name 1. A sign vehicle t is an illusion of a proper name (of some language L) if t is actually an expression of the different (non-nominal) linguistic category, e.g., definite description, predicate, demonstrative, etc.

The illusion of a name 2. A sign vehicle t is an illusion of a proper name (of some language L) if t is meaningless (it is not an expression of L at all).

Both claims are committed to a version of metalinguistic non-transparency—the claim that people might intend to use a symbol as being of a certain semantic category but fail to do so. But the similarities end here. Russell, for instance, when writing about regular proper names as disguised descriptions was committed to view 1. Bochner endorses view 2 and claims that the sentences containing empty names are not full-fledged sentences at all (242). I assume that Bochner’s claim might be formulated in the following manner:

(B) If t is intended (by a user) to be a proper name (of a given language) but t fails to refer, then t is a meaningless symbol (i.e., it is not an expression of the language at all).

The problem is that we cannot consistently hold (B) because if t is a meaningless symbol, then t simply lacks referential function, so it neither refers nor fails to refer. The problem is avoided if we endorse the following “Russellian” alternative to (B):

(R) If t is intended (by a user) to be a proper name (of a given language) but t fails to refer, then t is a meaningful symbol (of a given language) but of another semantic category.

This makes use of the first interpretation of the illusion of a name claim. Now, if we assume (R), we have at our disposal an intuitive analysis of empty names that is consistent with referentialism. We might simply say that empty expressions intended as proper names are singular terms of a different category, and that referentialist claims apply to such expressions exactly in the manner in which, according to referentialism, they should apply to expressions of the appropriate semantic category. For instance, we might treat them as demonstratives (blind ones?) or as descriptions. On both interpretations, we have an explanation of empty names and illusions of contingency that requires no appeal to possible languages. Moreover, such a solution is consistent with other aspects of the metasyntactic view. The former (i.e., demonstrative) interpretation is also in harmony with Bochner’s general theoretical inclination to stress the importance of indexicality in thought (256–257).

Let me close the review by stressing that this is an excellent book. It should be read by anyone interested in proper names, singular reference, rigidity, and modal epistemology. Additionally, it has enormous teaching potential. Even if one is not willing to follow the path of Bochner’s metasyntactic two-dimensionalism, it goes without saying that Bochner has written a magnificent multi-dimensional philosophical work. 


Work on this review was funded by a National Science Center, Poland grant under award number 2018/29/B/HS1/01868.


Bochner, G. (2013). The metasyntactic interpretation of two-dimensionalism. Philosophical Studies, 163(3): 611–626.

Carnap, R. (1947). Meaning and necessity: A study in semantics and modal logic. Chicago, IL, USA: University of Chicago Press.


[1] Bochner should speak about the problem of difference in informativeness of necessary equivalent propositions and avoid restricting the problem to necessary propositions. The difference in the informativeness of two necessary equivalent but contingent propositions (e.g., “Cicero was Roman” and “Tully was Roman”) also cannot be explained in terms of the exclusion of possibilities.

[2] This view has also been defended earlier in Bochner, 2013.