Narrative, Emotion, and Insight

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Noël Carroll and John Gibson (eds.), Narrative, Emotion, and Insight, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2011, 188pp., $64.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780271048574.

Reviewed by James Harold, Mount Holyoke College


Noël Carroll and John Gibson's Narrative, Emotion, and Insight is a thoughtful and wide-ranging anthology in the philosophy of the arts. In the Introduction, Gibson tells us that he and Carroll asked the contributors to discuss "at least two of the three terms of the title: narrative, emotion, and insight" (p. 2). The essays in the volume focus on narrative, rather than fiction, with the result that the essays discuss not how we can learn from and be affected by events that are fictional, but how we can learn from and be affected by stories.

The resulting essays are as different from one another as one would expect given the open-ended nature of the project, and the essays, on the whole, are also very good: Derek Matravers' and Peter Goldie's chapters are particular standouts. The topics range from examinations of why we enjoy sad songs (Aaron Smuts) to fictionalizing tendencies in narrative accounts of the self (Goldie) to the importance of discovery to tragic plots (Susan Feagin). Rather than attempt to give equal time to each of these nine very different essays, I begin with a theme that runs through three of them. A consequence is that this review slights the other contributors whose essays deserve a longer discussion, but choosing depth over breadth permits a more detailed philosophical discussion than a necessarily brief overview of each individual chapter would allow.

There is a particular subgenre of writing that most readers of contemporary philosophical aesthetics will instantly recognize. It involves both taking a close look at a particular work or works of art, and pressing a view about what the work is saying and why it matters philosophically. Works in this subgenre, or so I shall argue, employ a method which reduces works of art to philosophy, or to a set of philosophically interesting claims. They do this in three steps:

  1. Choose a work of art and defend a particular interpretation of that work.
  2. From that interpretation, extract a particular claim or claims that the work is understood as endorsing or defending.
  3. Subject that claim to philosophical evaluation.

The aim of this method is to show that works of art (or, at least, narrative works of art) can and do make claims that are philosophical, or philosophically significant. Usually (but not always) they are moral claims. Proponents of this method think of this process as vindicating the works of art: demonstrating their moral or cognitive value. The method is a philosophical reduction insofar as it attempts to show that, under the shiny narrative hood, a philosophical engine purrs.

Both Berys Gaut's and Noël Carroll's contributions to this anthology use this method. In his essay, John Gibson offers at least a partial analysis and further exploration, but his defense deserves scrutiny. Let's look a bit more closely at Gaut's and Carroll's chapters to see how this works, and then consider Gibson's discussion.

Gaut's essay, "Telling Stories: Narrative, Emotion, and Insight in Memento," employs the method just outlined, and shows its limitations. Gaut spends much of his essay defending a particular interpretive view concerning Christopher Nolan's film Memento (2000): viz, that the question of whether the protagonist, Leonard, killed his own wife, is "closed" to interpretation, and not, as some have claimed, open (that is, left unanswered by the film). He then goes on to argue that the film supports three substantive claims about memory: "some of what people think they remember is simply false or distorted" (p. 38); "what we remember and apparently remember is partly to be explained by our aims" (p. 38); and "memory is essential to understanding" (p. 39). These three claims, he thinks, are of philosophical interest, and he goes on to argue that they support "cognitive caution and rigor" but not philosophical skepticism or relativism: that "there is in the end a truth to be uncovered" (p. 42). Gaut believes that it is important that his interpretation of the film is correct (that the film positively establishes that Leonard killed his wife) or the film will fail to support these latter claims about truth and epistemic caution.

It is worth noting that, regardless of whether Gaut's specific interpretive view is correct, it is not disputed that the film explores a number of themes regarding the nature of memory. The film's structure and story prompt viewers to consider the distortions and unreliability of memory and the ways in which memories affect experience. (The film also, I would add, prompts us to think about personal identity and moral responsibility across time, as Leonard manipulates his future self to murder someone he now knows to be innocent but that his future self will believe is not.)

One might question what is gained philosophically by Gaut's insistence on the rightness of his interpretive claim about Leonard's role in his wife's death. This interpretation is supposed to offer support for cognitive caution, but not skepticism or anti-realism. But what kind of support is offered? That a film, or filmmaker, says "there is in the end a truth to be uncovered" lends no evidentiary weight to this philosophical claim, as far as I can tell. The film serves as an occasion for discussing memory and truth, and that is certainly of value. Why must we think of it as doing more: as making or establishing a particular claim about the relationship between memory and truth? To employ a distinction made by Monroe Beardsley[1] (later revived by Peter Lamarque and Stein Haugom Olsen[2]) seeing the film as offering a thesis that we should either accept or reject, rather than as giving us some rich themes to discuss and consider, constitutes an aesthetic loss in our experience of the film. The film has more to offer us as a work of art to the extent that we see it as generating discussion rather than endorsing claims.

In "Philosophicial Insight, Emotion, and Popular Fiction: The Case of Sunset Boulevard," Carroll analyzes Billy Wilder's Sunset Boulevard (1950), again employing the reductive method. Carroll argues that Wilder's film provides a maieutic argument for the thesis, stated in the film by the character of Joe Gillis, that "There's nothing tragic about being fifty -- not unless you try to be twenty-five" (p. 59). (It is not entirely clear how the argument is supposed to be maieutic, as Carroll characterizes it, when its thesis is explicitly stated.) According to Carroll, that the film does this shows how works of popular art can do philosophy. Carroll goes farther than Gaut in arguing that works of art do not merely make claims, they also make arguments for those claims.

Carroll notes that the theme of the film is the denial of death; the film returns again and again to the subject of aging and dying through motifs of sunsets, waxworks, and decay. But he is not content to discuss the film's theme; he argues that the film has a thesis: "what is monstrous and unnatural about Norma Desmond is her resistance to accepting her age" (p. 53). Like Gaut, Carroll's interpretation of the work is not in service of the discussion of a philosophical theme or idea, but in service of showing that the film has a thesis of philosophical significance.

It is important to note just how different this approach is from what is perhaps the best-known view about the philosophical importance of narrative artworks: Martha Nussbaum's arguments that great literature has philosophical import. According to Nussbaum, any attempt to describe what is philosophically and morally distinctive and valuable about literature in non-literary language is bound to fail. In her discussion of James' novel The Golden Bowl, for example, Nussbaum argues that no philosophical paraphrase can fully capture its moral meaning: "There are candidates for moral truth which the plainness of moral philosophy lacks the power to express, and which The Golden Bowl expresses wonderfully."[3] However, Gaut's and Carroll's attempts to distill the philosophical claims from art implicitly deny that such paraphrases are impossible.

The method faces a difficulty. As Katherine Thomson-Jones has noted,[4] if critical pluralism is a plausible view, the first step is called into question; there might not be any one interpretation that stands above the others. The mere fact that a character or narrator in a work advances a claim, even if the author avowed that claim, does not mean that the narrative makes the claim. Any interpretation about the claims made by a narrative must be able to outshine all its competitors. And it is not clear that this will always be the case. Gaut and Carroll are of course quite aware of this difficulty, and they spend some time attacking rival interpretations.

But a second problem is even more serious. The problem is that it is plausibly a bad-making feature of a narrative that it really says something that can be paraphrased in terms of a philosophical, or philosophically significant, claim which the work advances: such a work would be didactic. That is not to say that it is impossible or even difficult to advance such a claim through a narrative work of art -- Ayn Rand, for example, used her novels as the primary means of communicating her political views -- but doing so tends to kill the novel. To the extent that works of art advance claims, it is harder to see them as works of art at all, much less as good works of art. The problem with this method in philosophical aesthetics is that the more we treat works of art as objects of philosophical study, the less they are as works of art.

John Gibson's essay "Thick Narratives," which follows Gaut's and Carroll's, recognizes the limitations of the reductive method, and attempts to offer a balanced solution. He notes that "The contemporary debate tends to conceive of literature's ethically relevant activity as having an essentially evaluative character, consisting at root in the ways in which a work manifests attitudes of approbation and censure" (p. 70). He agrees with Carroll and Gaut (and many others) that works do manifest such attitudes, but he argues that they do something else as well. Gibson goes on to describe what he calls "thick narratives," invoking Bernard Williams' notion of thick ethical concepts, which do not make judgments or claims, but which, rather, "convey a sense of how a culture is constituted ethically" (p. 77). The idea is that narrative works of art have two moral centers: one is a claim or set of claims that the work endorses, and the other is the sense of a way of living or being in the world that can provide insight. The latter, he says, "has not received nearly enough philosophical attention" (p. 86).

As an example, Gibson considers George Orwell's critical discussion of Henry Miller's Tropic of Cancer (1934) and Louis-Ferdinand Céline's Journey to the End of the Night (1932). Orwell sees both of these books as having the same subject: modernity. But Orwell's critical view of Miller is particularly complex because, on the one hand, Orwell understands Tropic of Cancer as endorsing a repugnant view about modernity: that we should embrace modernity and the consequent collapse of morality. Insofar as it does this, Orwell thinks, it fails. Gibson quotes Orwell: "To say 'I accept' in an age like ours is to say that you accept concentration camps, rubber truncheons, Hitler, Stalin, bombs".[5] On the other hand, Orwell praises and recommends Miller's book, because (Gibson claims) Orwell recognized the novel's ethical value in "its attempt to fill out our sense of the ethical character of a culture -- to render it intelligible" (p. 85).

Gibson's aim is to accept the method at work in essays like Gaut's and Carroll's, but to claim that it is (or at least that it might be) incomplete: that works can have value not only in virtue of the claims that they appear to endorse, but also in virtue of the ways in which they invite us to explore a way of living. The difficulty with Gibson's analysis is that it does not go far enough. Once we accept that works can both be seen as endorsing a straightforward claim and as inviting an imaginative exploration of a way of living, it is clear that it is in the latter, not the former, that the value of narrative works of art qua works of art lie.

This is not to say that for an artwork to make a philosophical claim requires no artistic skill. In Gaut's essay, for example, he demonstrates in some detail how the specific artistic choices in the narrative structure (the reverse timeline, use of flashbacks, etc.) of Memento help to convey the nuanced messages about memory that Gaut thinks the film endorses. So it is certainly consistent with the reductive method to still notice and attend to the aesthetic features of the work as we tease out its thesis. But these aesthetic features are in principle separable from the message itself, as indeed both Carroll and Gaut show when they translate their work's purported theses into plain unadorned English.

When we see narrative works of art as asserting rather than exploring, we shut ourselves off to some of the insights and aspects of the work that are uniquely artistic. We take up an interpretative stance that requires us, in Gaut's terminology, to close off some interpretive possibilities (even when those possibilities are aesthetically rich). We are now looking at the work as if it were a debating partner; we are attempting to narrow it down to a set of claims we can see it as endorsing. And as an aesthetic stance, as a stance towards understanding a work of art, this is limiting. An aesthetically unremarkable piece of philosophical prose can make the same claims about memory that Gaut says Memento does, but no such distillation is possible for the kind of insights that Gibson, or Nussbaum, are after. These are ethical and philosophical thematic explorations that are necessarily artistic. This is why, for Orwell, the ethical swamps the moral, and why he is so taken with this book that appears to endorse a view to which he is deeply opposed: because the value of the novel lies elsewhere.

The anthology as a whole offers a great deal more than this one way of looking at narratives. In their chapters, Amy Mullin and Richard Eldridge discuss the value of narrative artworks in ways that do not depend on interpreting the work as endorsing a particular claim. Mullin does this by focusing on how reading literature can improve some ethically important skills, such as the ability "to recognize and properly identify our own emotions, and to reflect upon or be guided by what our emotional responses reveal about what we find significant" (p. 92). Her essay engages with some recent research in psychology to argue that reading novels (in the right way) can positively affect us and strengthen our autonomy. Through his discussion of Goethe's "Wandrers Nachtlied II," Eldridge argues that what he calls a "narrative rehearsal" -- a thinking-through of possible ways of living life -- is a potential source of insight that narrative artworks can offer.

Smuts and Feagin focus on emotion in specific narrative forms: Smuts asks why we are attracted to sad songs, and Feagin argues for the importance of tragic discovery in modern drama. Smuts' claim, that it is because listening to sad songs makes us sad that we want to listen to them, is initially counter-intuitive, but he argues that sad songs offer us opportunities to understand the sources of sadness and that this can only be done by experiencing sadness. Smuts characterizes his view as "anti-cathartic". However, some (such as Stephen Halliwell[6] and Martha Nussbaum[7]) who understand the process of catharsis itself as primarily cognitive and involving greater self-insight might contend that his view is indeed cathartic, because they understand catharsis in terms of clarification rather than purgation. For Feagin, interestingly, thecharacters in tragedy benefit from much the same kind of self-knowledge when they make a tragic discovery. Her focus, however, is on the internal function of these moments and their effects on the characters and the work, not on the reader.

The first and last essays of the volume stand alone, and each is quite remarkable. The first contribution is by Goldie. His is the only essay in the book that is not about narrative works of art. Goldie's concern is with self-narratives, and particularly with the problem of fictionalizing oneself to oneself. He catalogs these tendencies and notes their dangers (e.g., we come to expect that events in our lives will have closure, and this is often not the case), but he also finds some hope for self-improvement in them. His novel and even-handed discussion is highly recommended.

The final essay in the volume is a contribution to an old debate, the "paradox of fiction," and I would like to imagine that it could be the final word in that debate. The so-called paradox says (in one version, at least) that apparently emotional responses to fictional situations are not emotions after all: we don't really feel afraid at the movies, evidenced by the fact that we don't run out of the theater. And we don't run because we don't really believe what we're seeing is real -- we know it is fictional. The literature on this problem is vast and complex, but Matravers' solution is simple and elegant. He argues that the difference between our emotional responses in "real life" and our emotional responses in the cases with which philosophers are concerned has nothing at all to do with their being fictional, and everything to do with their beingrepresentations. He argues that our reactions to fictional and non-fictional narratives, which are alike in other respects, are the same. What the focus on fiction has done, according to Matravers, is to divert our attention from the underlying phenomenon: the distinctive ways in which we respond to representations of events, rather than to the events themselves. Returning us to the central mission of focusing on narrative rather than fiction, Matravers' refreshing essay makes for a perfect finish to this rich and varied anthology.

[1] Monroe Beardsley, Aesthetics: Problems in the Philosophy of Criticism, 2nd ed. (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 1981), Chapter IX, "Literature and Knowledge," pp. 400-453.

[2] Peter Lamarque and Stein Haugom Olsen, Truth, Fiction, and Literature (Oxford University Press, 1994).

[3] Martha Nussbaum, "Flawed Crystals: James's The Golden Bowl and Literature as Moral Philosophy," in her Love's Knowledge: Essays on Philosophy and Literature(Oxford, 1990), p. 142.

[4] Katherine Thomson-Jones, "Art, Ethics, and Critical Pluralism," Metaphilosophy 43.3 (2012), 275-293.

[5] George Orwell, "Inside the Whale," in An Age Like This, 1920-1940. Vol. I of The Collected Essays, Journalism, and Letters of George Orwell, ed. Sonia Orwell and Ian Angus, 493-502. Quoted in Gibson, p. 83.

[6] Stephen Halliwell, Aristotle's Poetics (University of Chicago, 1998).

[7] Martha Nussbaum, The Fragility of Goodness: Luck and Ethics in Greek Tragedy and Philosophy (Cambridge University Press, 1986).