Narrative, Identity and the Kierkegaardian Self

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John Lippitt and Patrick Stokes (eds.), Narrative, Identity and the Kierkegaardian Self, Edinburgh University Press, 2015, 234pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748694433.

Reviewed by Claudia Welz, University of Copenhagen


According to the blurb, this collection explores “contemporary problems of self, time, narrative and death,” drawing on insights from Kierkegaard. More precisely, it discusses the strengths and weaknesses of narrative accounts of selfhood. Several of the thirteen papers included in the anthology were presented at a conference at the University of Hertfordshire in 2011; three papers are revised versions of previously published essays.

The body of the book can be roughly divided into three sections. The first contains five papers that demonstrate the confluence of Kierkegaardian, neo-Lockean, Heideggerian, analytic and phenomenological literatures around the topic of personal identity. The second section, with the next five papers, extends “the debate between Kierkegaardian narrativists and narratosceptics” (7); while the three papers of the third section discuss the ambiguous role of death, which, on the one hand, is the necessary condition for understanding life in narrative terms and, on the other, is a radical interruption of life that threatens narrative intelligibility.

The first section begins with general reflections on whether our fragmented lives can be understood in narrative terms at all.

In highlighting structural similarities between human life and literature, Marya Schechtman argues in favor of the “narrative self-constitution view” according to which “we constitute ourselves as persons by operating with a (largely implicit) autobiographical narrative which serves as an organising psychological principle of our lives” (13). Having a narrative conception of one’s life is, for Schechtman, not only like reading a novel that one has not read before but also like co-authoring our life’s narrative. While we cannot change previous episodes, we can endeavor to redirect our lives in the future (24f).

In contrast to Schechtman, Roman Altshuler contends that narrative neither constitutes nor unifies selfhood; instead, it only expresses our identity and unifies our agency. From Heidegger’s (non-narrative) view of Dasein, Altshuler extracts a teleological theory: “we have our whole self as the telos of our existence” (30). Dasein exists as an anticipated whole that depends on an open, indeterminate future. While concrete life “cannot be unified by a narrative without confabulation” (40), this form of falsification is regarded as a good thing since it allows us to act.

Anthony Rudd’s “Kierkegaard’s Platonic Teleology” portrays Kierkegaard as a narrative thinker who advances “a teleological view of selfhood and ethics” (46), which implies that one has the ethical task of shaping oneself with regard to a goal. This goal is, for Kierkegaard as well as for Plato, the good. They do not understand the human quest for the good as a realization of natural potentialities. Rather, our telos is “to achieve psychological wholeness” and “to properly relate ourselves” to God or the Good as the ultimate reality (53). These are not separate goals, for “the self can only resolve its conflicting elements into a proper harmony through relating itself as a whole to the Good” (54). As Kierkegaard emphasizes in The Purity of Heart, willing the Good for its own sake excludes double-mindedness. Following MacIntyre, Rudd claims that narrative unity “is itself an ethical ideal” (59). He tries to demonstrate that this is also Kierkegaard’s view, yet the quotes from Either/Or only substantiate the need for self-continuity in hope and recollection and the need for a consistent orientation to the good.

Patrick Stokes argues that “the Kierkegaardian self cannot just be a narrative” because Kierkegaard’s orientation to salvation “requires a self that transcends its concrete and relational constitution” in looking ahead “to a life outside time” that is not a simple continuation of earthly life (64). In fact, Stokes finds references in Kierkegaard to what he calls a “naked self” (64, 73), which is conceptually and experientially separable from its story, history, and facticity. He suggests that the next move for narrativist accounts of identity “is to shift their focus from the construction of diachronic narratives to a consideration of the present-tense experience of relating to those constructed narratives” (65), thereby interrelating the phenomenal time of the soul with the narrated time of the story.

Stokes seems to agree with Dan Zahavi’s Husserlian account of selfhood when he affirms the distinction between a “minimal self” and a “narrative self” (or “self” vs. “person”) and regards the experiencing subject as a prerequisite for narrative self-constitution (74). It remains unclear how he can at the same time claim to remain “agnostic about the claims made for and about narrative selfhood” (75). The resources Stokes discovers in Kierkegaard concern the way in which the prospect of having to account for our lives as a whole may change our experience of time in the here-and-now: “once we posit that eternal judgement could come at any time, the narrative/biological ‘now’ also becomes ‘the eleventh hour’” (74). Kierkegaard’s work may offer “secular analogues to soteriology,” for instance by inviting the question, “If I died right now, would my life have been worth it?” (75). The reader is left wondering whether a ‘naked’ or ‘minimal self’ can raise such questions; if it cannot, what is the point of shifting focus to a consideration of present-tense experience that by definition is separated from the history on which self-narration is based? Do Kierkegaard’s texts not challenge such abstract, a-historical, and non-personal definitions of selfhood?

Michael Strawser’s “Kierkegaard’s Erotic Reduction and the Problem of Founding the Self,” questions attempts to show that ‘the core self’ is a tacit and non-thematic structural feature of conscious experience (i.e., the first-personal givenness of experiential phenomena in pre-reflective consciousness) — and with these attempts, he questions Stokes’ claim that Kierkegaard is connected with the phenomenological tradition through his affirming a similar view 60 years before Husserl (80). Strawser suggests, instead, that “it is through the first-person access” to pre-reflective conscious experience that the latter “takes on the quality of mineness” (85). As a consequence, “the argument that the ‘sense of self’ given in pre-reflective consciousness is the purely subjective first-person givenness of what it is like to be me is at best a narratively constituted product of reflection” (88). While this criticism is incisive, Strawser’s attempt to find an ‘erotic reduction’ in Kierkegaard’s edifying discourse “Love Will Hide a Multitude of Sins” (1843) and in Works of Love (1847), which “leads not only beyond sin, but beyond self as well” (90), is not convincing — for how could one love another without being oneself and surrendering oneself? Furthermore, Kierkegaard as a phenomenologist of love is not as neglected as Strawser suggests (for references see my chapter “Kierkegaard and Phenomenology” in Oxford Handbook of Kierkegaard, 2013).

The second section of the book weighs the pros and cons of seeing Kierkegaard as a narrativist.

In regard to Either/Or, Walter Wietzke (“Narrative and Normativity”) qualifies the idea that narrative theory can adequately explain the transition between aesthetic and ethical existence. He argues that “certain aesthetic practices are capable of sustaining complex narratives”; and that the problem is not that the aesthete is self-consciously divided against himself but rather that he cannot maintain control of his life when its enjoyment depends on factors that lie outside himself (104). On this view, Rudd overstates the extent to which an agent is motivated by a moral telos (109).

According to Eleanor Helms (“The End in the Beginning: Eschatology in Kierkegaard’s Literary Criticism”), Kierkegaard’s theory of selfhood includes exhortations toward making coherent sense of one’s life, but these always occur in the context of warnings against cheap or easy narrative unity (113). Analyzing Kierkegaard’s understanding of transfiguration (Forklarelse), Helms shows that personal continuity “is received from elsewhere” (116). She follows John J. Davenport in insisting that continuity in life and literature is fulfilled through disruption or “eucatastrophe”: a victory of the good that no human agent can bring about (119). Since the self does not just ‘have’ a narrative, but “expects to discover narrative unity in the world” (123), Helms concludes that the self is more of a reader than an author or narrator of life, hoping until the last moment that the parts will add up to a whole.

John Lippitt revisits the desirability of wholeheartedness as a key dimension of Davenport’s account of narrative unity. In discussing Freud’s ‘Rat Man,’ who is faced with conflicting feelings both of which are significant for his self-understanding, Lippitt argues against Harry Frankfurt, who insists that the Rat Man should have acknowledged his love and repressed his hatred. In line with David Velleman, Lippitt claims that the Rat Man’s problem was not ambivalence but rather his response to it: had he addressed and worked through his mixed feelings, his attitude would have been truthful. Lippitt proposes that wholeheartedness, “even as a regulative ideal, is a term apt to mislead” (136). He points to cases of self-forgiveness that continue to incorporate self-reproach in order to attribute a pro-ambivalence view to Kierkegaard, who in The Purity of Heart stresses the importance of repentance. Yet the conclusion that what pleases God is something very different from wholeheartedness (141) is flawed and throws out the baby with the bathwater. Kierkegaardian wholeheartedness fits with the ambivalence of mixed feelings, as long as it is acknowledged; but it excludes a divided will in responding to these feelings.

In “The Virtues of Ambivalence: Wholeheartedness as Existential Telos and the Unwillable Completion of Narravives,” John J. Davenport responds to Wietzke, Lippitt, and Helms, who have challenged the adequacy of his conception of practical identities as “narravives” (living processes of accumulating meaning-relations with a narrative-like temporal structure). He explains, for example, that Frankfurt “recommends volitional wholeheartedness” (147) and that “emotional conflict does not amount to volitional conflict” (149). However, when suggesting that the term “whole-willed-ness” is preferable to wholeheartedness since “we are stuck with the ambivalence of ‘heart’” (150), Davenport overlooks the fact that Kierkegaard follows the biblical tradition, according to which the heart (Hebrew: lev) is the very center of a person, thus embracing feeling and willing. Moreover, it remains debatable whether our existential telos indeed demands narrative unity (154) and whether this unity is “received by grace, but must build on good works” (158).

Building on Charles Taylor’s “historical-hermeneutical-ethical” notion of selfhood (161) and “the Protestant rejection of good works” (162), Matias Møl Dalsgaard discusses “Kierkegaardian Selfhood” by referring to the “non-narrative ideals” (166) of joy, obedience, and silence as exemplified in Kierkegaard’s discourse on The Lily in the Field and the Bird of the Air. Dalsgaard’s “history of the good will” is misleading insofar as it ascribes a demand for “blind obedience” to Luther and reduces “a person in his totality” to the will (166).

The third section of the book is dedicated to a discussion of the role of death in narrative models of selfhood.

Michael J. Sigrist interprets the incomplete temporal existence of Dasein in Heidegger as ruling out “the narrativists’s idea of closure” (174). Death as the end of one’s life or world is neither a part of life nor its completion. The narrative structure of human life is not “apparent within one’s life as something that one can experience”; rather, it is a form of representation of one’s life (184).

Kathy Behrendt demonstrates that although the concepts of a closed beginning-middle-and-end structure, of finitude, completeness, life shapes, anticipatory closure, telos, and retroactive meaning-conferral reinforce the view that life’s end potentially enhances its narrative’s meaning, this view receives little corroboration from narrativist accounts.

While Rudd concedes that understanding a whole life as a narrative may be an unattainable ideal, George Pattison contends that this unattainability “retrospectively undermines the narrative thesis as such” (206). Pattison investigates three Kierkegaard biographies, which agree that Kierkegaard’s death in the middle of his attack on the Church was the consummation of his life: the first by Nazi philosopher Alfred Baeumler (consistently spelled wrongly: “Bauemler”), the second by Anglican Kierkegaard-translator Walter Lowrie, and the third by psychoanalytically oriented biographer Josiah Thompson. Considering “Kierkegaard’s Death and its Implications for Telling his Story,” Pattison comes to the conclusion that the uncertainty of death relativizes all possible narratives. For Kierkegaard, the retroactive power of the thought of death lies in “the demand that we live well today” (215).

As my summary of contents indicates, this is a rich collection of essays that will stimulate the current debate on the topics addressed.  However, the volume does not live up to the expectations raised by the blurb:

This collection brings together, for the first time between the covers of one book, leading figures from both the debate on Kierkegaard and narrative, and the wider discussion of philosophy and narrative identity, along with new voices, to explore pressing issues in selfhood and moral psychology.

First, the extent to which leading figures are ‘brought together’ in a fruitful discussion of issues that are highly controversial — not only within the field of Kierkegaard research but also between different (analytic and continental) traditions of philosophizing — is limited, and Kierkegaard’s texts are not discussed thoroughly in regard to narrativist accounts of selfhood and personal identity. In fact, four of the essays do not even mention Kierkegaard, while most of the others deal with his thought only briefly and superficially. It is still a desideratum to reflect upon how alternative methodological approaches bear upon our understanding of Kierkegaard’s position and what the latter can contribute to the wider discussion.

Second, the claim that Kierkegaard “has been largely absent” (4) from general discussions of narrative identity and that this collection of essays brings him into focus ‘for the first time’ in this context is surprising. Both editors of the collection have been visiting scholars at the Søren Kierkegaard Research Centre, University of Copenhagen, where questions of personal identity and narrative or non-narrative self-constitution have been discussed for two decades — precisely by bringing Kierkegaard into dialogue with Locke, Heidegger, Ricoeur, Taylor, MacIntyre, Frankfurt, etc. The editors’ claim might in part be due to their neglect of non-English literature by, e.g., Johannes Sløk, Michael Theunissen, Arne Grøn, Iben Damgaard, and René Rosfort.

Yet this neglect does not explain why none of the contributors to the collection refer to English articles by the aforementioned researchers, for instance to Grøn’s 2004 articles “Self and Identity” and “The Embodied Self: Reformulating the Existential Difference in Kierkegaard.” The chapters assembled in the anthology are supposed to “mark how far the debate has come and suggest where it might go next” (5). However, it is conspicuous that ‘the’ debate is defined in a narrow way by a circle of writers who only cite each other. The idea of using a cover image by Vilhelm Hammershøi is not new either, but imitates Grøn’s seminal study Subjektivitet og negativitet: Kierkegaard (1997), which discusses personal identity in relation to key notions such as alterity, normativity, embodiment, temporality, self-determination, language, and religion.

Therefore I recommend reading the present collection in combination with the pioneering work that it ignores.