Narrative Identity, Autonomy, and Mortality: From Frankfurt and MacIntyre to Kierkegaard

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John J. Davenport, Narrative Identity, Autonomy, and Mortality: From Frankfurt and MacIntyre to Kierkegaard, Routledge, 2012, 230pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415894135.

Reviewed by William McDonald, University of New England, Australia


This book gives a systematic defense of narrative practical identity. It also constructs a positive concept of narrative practical identity, which it dubs "narravive." The defense is against objections to narrative identity found in the work of Bernard Williams, Galen Strawson, John Lippitt, and Patrick Stokes. The positive concept is built on earlier work by John Davenport and Anthony Rudd, arising from their anthology Kierkegaard after MacIntyre: Essays on Freedom, Narrative, and Virtue (Carus Publishing, 2001). In the present book Davenport builds on work by David Carr, Paul Ricoeur, Charles Taylor, Christine Korsgaard, Kim Atkins, Anthony Rudd, and others to offer a sophisticated, multi-layered model of narrative identity, which addresses all the specific criticisms of earlier models, though he is at pains to point out that this is a model for practical identity only and is not adequate on its own for establishing numerical identity of persons over time.

Davenport also shows how his model of practical identity can be used to analyze autonomy as a higher-order form of narrative unity. In doing so he builds on the hierarchical analysis of personal autonomy found in the work of Harry Frankfurt and Gerald Dworkin. Davenport distinguishes various levels of narrative unity, from "unity-0" ("minimal continuity of consciousness . . . due to diachronic unity of apperception or to robust connections in memory-contents . . . [which enables] consciousness . . . to recognize experiences across time as belonging to the same animal"), through "unity-1" (which draws on "teleological relations of significance necessary for minimally effective planning agency" (56)), to "unity-2" (which by means of "reflexive modifications of prethetic meanings" (69) acquires a degree of self-constancy, caring and coherence that amounts to "formal autonomy"), to "unity-3," which is required for "deep responsibility" for one's volitional character (which amounts to "wholehearted" ethical autonomy), and finally "unity-4," which is the type of narrative unity acquired through religious faith in a life that transcends death.

In his presentation of the higher stages of unity, which exhibit the greatest narrative continuity, Davenport draws heavily on Kierkegaard. In particular he draws on Kierkegaard's discourse "Purity of Heart," in which various forms of "double-mindedness" and other failures of integrity are depicted for the edification of those in pursuit of wholehearted practical identity. In the process, he not only demonstrates how Kierkegaard's work is still extremely relevant to modern debates but also throws important light on the interpretation of some key points in Kierkegaard.

Davenport's model of narrative practical identity is a form of narrative realism. It does not depend on any narrative explicitly being formulated or told, but rather depends upon one's life actually being structured like a narrative. In order to reinforce this point, and to distinguish narrative practical identity from the stories told about a life, he coins the term narravive. Herein lies one of the major shortcomings of the book. While Davenport offers precise accounts and refutations of the many objections to theories of narrative identity, he fails to spell out systematically in exactly which respects a narravive is like a narrative and in which respects it differs -- though he emphasizes that a narrative is told or recounted and a narravive need not be. Nevertheless, after citing some definitions of narrative found in "online glossaries of literary terms" (71), Davenport introduces what he calls the "robust conception" of "narrativity":

A robust narrative sequence (or weave) is one in which a temporally ordered set of events, actions, interactions, emotions, attitudes, and related psychic states constitute a pattern of effective agency (coordinated lines of intentional action planned over long terms within comprehensible social and natural settings) for at least one character pursuing at least minimally complementary activities, and are experienced (at least from the perspective of that character) as forming a holistic web of meaning-relations that develops cumulatively -- in part, through the progression of action and modification of plans in light of new contingencies, and in part through compounding associative connections between elements of the sequence. (81-82)

This definition, however, is flawed in one crucial respect. Some of the main objections to narrative accounts of agency derive from the assumption that "narrative structure requires narration" (53-54), which is dubbed by Davenport "the logos fallacy." Davenport undermines the objections deriving from this assumption by affirming what he calls "the Analogy thesis":

(A) the truthmaker of a biographical narrative itself has something much like the multidimensional weave of temporally extended meaning-relations that we find in stories recounted, told, or made in human expositions -- even though much of the cumulative web of significance that acts as truthmaker for a biography is not (in its first order) a result of any interpersonal or intrapersonal logos, communicative accounting, or reflective act. (55-56)

Yet Davenport 's robust conception of narrativity is defined in part by reference to the experience of "a holistic web of meaning-relations" and to the "modification of plans in light of new contingencies," which are respectively implicitly intrapersonal and reflective. The Analogy thesis does qualify its claim by pointing out that the truthmaker for a biography is not any "interpersonal or intrapersonal logos" in its first order, which opens up the possibility that "communicative accounting" and reflective acts might play a role as truthmakers of narrative identity at higher orders of unity. But the "robust conception" purports to define "narrativity" in general, and not just higher orders of narrative unity. Furthermore, Davenport claims that a unique narrative practical identity is constituted by a combination of unity-0 and unity-1 and "need not include stronger kinds of narrative unity associated with personal autonomy" (56). So, narrative practical identity does not require the higher-order levels of unity that are reflective and intrapersonal, yet it is like narrativity in the robust conception, which implicitly does require reflective acts and an "intrapersonal logos."

There is some indication of ways in which narravives are like and unlike narratives. But these are not presented systematically or in synoptic form. One similarity is that "the function of point of view in generating narrative structure in artifact-narratives seems clearly derived from the way that unity-0 of consciousness provides a basis for the developing relations of meaning-to-an-agent that we find in a person's real life" (58). It is not clear whether this analogy would hold only for points of view that are not identified with higher levels of unity, such as unity-3 and unity-4. Yet when Kierkegaard is invoked to illustrate higher levels of unity, his examples are usually taken to be paradigmatic of points of view -- in the form of existential stages of life. The higher levels beyond unity-1 can also be unlike literary narratives in that they need not follow the "codes of a genre" (58). Yet, since "the basic human capacity to make secondary narratives, including nonfictional or broadly 'historical' accounts and fictional stories, is derived from our experience in living out primary narratives -- both those that constitute individual practical identities, and those that constitute looser identities of interpersonal groups," (57) we often interpret patterns in our lives according to "paradigm scripts" "accumulated by storymakers down the ages" (58) so that our narravives are like narratives.

Narravives are only like narratives because likeness is supposed to be a symmetrical relation. Yet there is reason to doubt this symmetry. Likeness can imply the asymmetrical relation of original and copy, and this implication is reinforced by Davenport's examples of likeness on the grounds of derivation -- that is, narratives are like narravives because the former are derived from the latter. Another way in which narratives are asymmetrical with narravives is that the latter are far more complex in "the almost infinite detail of significance in actual lived experience" (58). So it is not in the detailed content, but in their structure that narravives are not "unlike a narrative composed in some language" (59). This Davenport calls the "Incompleteness thesis." Whether being not unlike is equivalent to being analogous depends on how well the likeness of structure is demonstrated. Davenport does not really say enough about what constitutes structure, other than to break narrative practical identity down into the different levels.

In order to distinguish "narrative sequences from other temporally ordered sequences of events," (73) and thereby address what he calls the triviality objection, Davenport invokes "the unity of ethos" (77). He draws on Northrop Frye to define "theme" as

the unity of an ethos . . . [as] a distinctive way of being (thinking, feeling, acting etc.) seen in motifs that do not reduce to a single idea, single didactic point, or single plot-line, but that is more than mere logical consistency or holistic coherence, because it is revealed in patterns repeated across different contexts in life. (77)

He takes Kierkegaard's existential stages to be "types of ethos in this sense: an individual's ethos is a token of these types, depending on the basic stance of their will towards varied aspects of life and an associated 'life-view,' which controls the overall thematic shape of their life-experience at the level of unity-1" (77-78). An ethos can change, and so is not sufficient for unifying a narrative. It therefore needs to be complemented with a notion of progression, which is teleological but not necessarily conceived as "development towards a peak" (79). Davenport takes cumulative development to be "a necessary condition for narrativity," where cumulative development "results in part from the way that relations (R1a) among earlier elements and (R1b) between later elements generate higher-order relations (R2) between R1a and R1b that modify first-order relations -- a symptom of holism" (79). Although Davenport frequently mentions Kierkegaard's notion of "life-view," which he seeks to clarify by means of Alastair MacIntyre's notion of the unity of a life and narrative continuity, he might well have used Kierkegaard's notion of "life-development" here to bolster his notion of cumulative development of a thematically unified ethos.

Nevertheless, Davenport draws on Kierkegaard's critique of the aesthetic mode of existence as despairingly episodic, as well as on Harry Frankfurt's contrast between "wanton" agents and those "who shape their character by forming a higher-order will," to counter Galen Strawson's view that personal identity can be no more than episodic. Davenport then reinterprets Frankfurt's notion of "wholeheartedness" to be "unity among higher-order volitions" (91) to develop the thesis that autonomy consists in wholeheartedly striving for one's higher-order volitions. This striving demands that the agent care sincerely for the ends and values pursued, and that these ends and values be perceived as "inherently worth caring about" independently of the agent's "prior desires or preferences, though not of her history" (105). Wholeheartedness, furthermore, requires that "a person must avoid essential conflicts between higher-order volitions," and that no particular care be "in essential conflict with any other of the agent's cares" (112). Wholeheartedness is, then, "a higher-order end regulating other projects and commitments, not be confused with the goals constitutive of practices or other finite goods at which first-order cares appropriately aim" (115). This "Regulative thesis" is fleshed out primarily by means of Kierkegaard's discourse "Purity of Heart."

Wholeheartedness goes beyond merely formal autonomy, to achieve unity-3, by virtue of its higher-order norms or ideals. By sincere adherence to these, the agent can strive for continuity through changes even with respect to seemingly fundamental values and cares. Where there appears to be tragic conflict among these cares, the agent needs to recognize the human limits to the possibility of success in striving to fulfill cares by adopting what Kierkegaard calls an attitude of "infinite resignation." Infinite resignation "is a narrative process," since it is a volitional state which "is ongoing, repeatedly renewed" and amounts to "a kind of infinite 'patience,' and volitional unity requires such patience" (145). By adopting a realist regard for values and cares as having intrinsic value, the wholehearted agent can conceive of being in error, even on the basis of self-deceit. Drawing on "Purity of Heart" Davenport formulates what he calls his PH thesis, that "In truth to will one thing can therefore mean only to will the good" (134). Wholehearted striving for the good, then, requires self-scrutiny as well as scrutiny of the world. The requirements of wholeheartedness developed by Davenport go a long way towards addressing Lippitt's concerns about narrative identity, which include the possibility of "self-deceptive autobiographies, monomania, fanaticism, and the need for openness to novel perspectives in light of which one might change ground-projects" (129).

The notion of mortality enters the picture in two ways. First, death marks an insurmountable limit to human achievement and therefore reinforces the infinite resignation of a pure heart. Successful completion of even the most wholehearted tasks will always be threatened by death. Second, mortality seems to undermine the possibility of a narrative practical identity ever being "whole." Davenport distinguishes what he calls "the bifurcation or 4D objection" from "the mortality objection," but presents them as two horns of a dilemma:

if the narrative self is equated with its whole life-story as it stands finished at death, then it is distinct from the self as free agent making conscious choices in time; but if the narrative self is instead identified with the sense that a living subject making free choices has of its practical identity at any given time, then it is in principle incomplete, or in a crucial sense not "a whole" until death, when it is no longer a self in that living sense (152-153).

Davenport argues that both Merricks and Stokes, who present versions of the bifurcation or 4D objection, presuppose either the tenseless view of time or "the presentist species of the tensed view" of time (154). He opts instead for "the growing block" species of the tensed view. This fits well with his idea of narravive having a cumulative development: "Your full practical identity . . . is always uniquely constituted by your narravive up until now. There is more content in this narravive now than there was ten years ago, but it is also the same narravive" (155). Furthermore, "anticipatory resoluteness" towards death (to use Kierkegaard's term) can use "the incompleteness recognized in the death-objection" as itself "the basis for earnest reflection on the whole direction of our life" (161). Death can also be used to develop the perspective of an eternal meaning for our lives, even if after death we no longer have the freedom to change it. Davenport represents Kierkegaard's notion of the "eternal validity" of our selves as the meaning of our narravive being preserved eternally. But he admits that it takes religious faith to believe that this is possible.

The account of narrative practical identity presented in this book is nuanced, sophisticated, and answers many of the objections given to specific versions elsewhere. Although it leaves room for further development, it provides an excellent base upon which to build. It also provides a powerful perspective from which to read Kierkegaard's notions of existential stages, double-mindedness, patience, infinite resignation, and purity of heart.