Narratives and Narrators: A Philosophy of Stories

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Gregory Currie, Narratives and Narrators: A Philosophy of Stories, Oxford University Press, 2010, 243pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199282609.

Reviewed by James Harold, Mount Holyoke College


I expect Gregory Currie's new book, Narratives and Narrators, to attain the same importance and influence in philosophical thinking about narrative that his earlier books The Nature of Fiction and Image and Mind have had in the philosophy of fiction and film, respectively. It is an ambitious, careful, and philosophically rich work containing a number of novel and important arguments. The book is not driven by a single overarching thesis; it is, rather, a wide-ranging discussion of a variety of topics associated with narrative. Currie will sometimes move from one topic to examine a loosely related issue before returning to the central thread. For example, several chapters end with appendices that offer evolutionary hypotheses which, if proven, would lend modest auxiliary support to the main argument of the chapter. Although these and other asides sometimes seem unnecessary, they are never uninteresting.

The book begins with an account of what narratives are and then moves to examine a series of philosophical problems about narrators and narratives, for example: the relationship between narrators and authors; the ubiquity of narrators thesis; the nature of point of view and how it is conveyed; the puzzle of imaginative resistance; the nature of irony and pretence; and, perhaps most surprisingly, skepticism about the notion of character, which has heretofore mostly been discussed in connection with virtue ethics and meta-ethics. An "analytical contents" section immediately following the traditional Table of Contents does an excellent job of distilling the essential argumentative pieces of the book; this is an especially helpful device for readers who may be looking to jump into the middle of the book to see what Currie has to say about one of these particular questions.

Some of the standout sections of the book include Currie's careful and moderate treatment of the nature of narrative, his refutation of the "ubiquity of narrators" thesis, and his subtle and compelling account of point of view. In each of these cases, Currie is fair to his critics and cautious in his conclusions. He builds on his conclusions in sometimes surprising ways. His theory of point of view is used as a basis for a theory of irony, which in turn leads him to a detailed reading of Hitchcock's The Birds (1963) in Chapter 9.

Rather than attempting to summarize the various arguments in the book, I here select two of particular interest for a closer discussion. The first is Currie's initial account of what narrative is; the second is his somewhat inconclusive discussion of the impact of character skepticism on a theory of narrative.

Currie sets out two necessary conditions for something's being a narrative: it must be a corpus (a unified body of representations), and it must be an intentional-communicative artifact (an object whose function, which it has from its maker, is telling a story). However, not all artifactual corpora are narratives, and no additional sufficient condition exists to set off those that are from those that aren't. Instead, artifactual corpora differ from one another in degree of narrativity, where narrativity is, very roughly, the degree of particularity, causal connectedness of events, and attention to the motives of the characters. So "narrative" may be used to refer to artifactual corpora with a great deal of narrativity (above some salient threshold), or simply those that have some degree of narrativity.

Currie's taking narrativity as a matter of degree rather than kind is quite plausible; the notion of a thing's being high or low in narrativity is much more sensible, and accords much better with our practices, than a categorical account. Narratives are very different from one another and the notion of narrative is highly contextual, so any categorical account would be susceptible to a variety of serious problem cases. So Currie's regarding narrativity as a matter of degree is an asset.

However, Currie allows no such flexibility in his requirement that all narratives be intentional-communicative artifacts. Currie argues that all non-artifactual corpora -- he specifically mentions dreams, memories, and lives -- cannot be narratives. One might construct a narrative out of the representations in a dream, he says, but without the intention of a maker, the dream itself lacks the potential for narrativity. Currie argues that: "The function of a narrative is to tell a story, and a story may be told -- rather than accidentally conveyed -- only through the process of making which aims at communication." (6)

While accepting Currie's claim that nothing is a narrative that does not tell a story, we might question his contention that a corpora only tells a story if it was created with a communicative intention. It is true that we cannot see something as a narrative unless it seems to us that a story is being told, not just accidentally conveyed. But why couldn't a person, thinking of her dream, recall the dream as if it were a story being told by someone with a communicative intention? We might call such things "as-if" narratives; they are seen by their audiences as expressing communicative intention, despite the lack of such intention in reality. But it seems that once viewed as a vehicle for telling a story, as-if narratives take on the same features of other narratives: for example, they can be judged as being either high or low in narrativity. Currie is right that any corpus that is to be called a narrative must be treated as if it were the product of an act of communication; but it is not clear that the object must in fact have been created for the purpose of telling a story.

Consider the possibility of a corpus erroneously thought to be the product of an intentional act of communication. Perhaps archeologists discover a text that lists a series of events. In fact, the corpus was created by a series of different authors, each of whom simply recorded some event of interest to them, as a memory aid, with no attention being paid to what had been written above. Discovering this document hundreds of years later, it is thought to be the product of a single maker, and the events listed are connected by the readers and seen as a narrative. Plausibly this corpus is a narrative, despite its origins. Certainly there is no difference for the reader who wishes to treat it as one.

Perhaps the most interesting discussion in the book comes in the last chapter, which takes some concerns that have been much discussed in recent moral philosophy and considers their import for a theory of narrative. Currie notes that John Doris ("Persons, Situations, and Virtue Ethics," Noûs 32 (1998): 504-30) and Gilbert Harman ("Moral Psychology Meets Social Psychology: Virtue Ethics and the Fundamental Attribution Error," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 99 (1999): 315-31) have taken some findings from social psychology and applied them to virtue ethics. Doris and Harman argue that a considerable body of research in social psychology suggests that personality traits like generosity are local rather than global, situational rather than independent. Predictions of behavior based on global moral traits do poorly; predictions based on situational facts do much better. This research, they claim, suggests a basis for skepticism for some versions of virtue ethics, which centers on the development of stable, deep-seated character traits generating moral behavior. Doris and Harman's arguments are deeply contested, both because of questions about the psychological research and because it is contested whether virtue ethics really depends on character in the ways that Doris and Harman think. The literature in response to these arguments is quite large, and it is fair to say that character skepticism has had a significant impact on how philosophers think about virtue ethics.

Currie notices -- and as far as I know, he is the first to notice -- that skepticism about character of the kind supported by Doris and Harman would be a threat not just to virtue ethics, but also to a very common and very plausible view about narrative that he himself supports. In Chapter 10, Currie argued that narratives are well-suited to representing an agent's character and that character is just the kind of thing that makes narrative engaging and popular. However, if Doris and Harman are right, then, given the mutually supporting connections he has previously established between character and narrative, narrative might be in trouble. Currie claims that character skepticism calls into question "the extent to which we credit literary representations with the power to give us insights into Character" (207). He later notes that it might be in part because of narratives, which often represent agents' moral characters as crucial in determining their actions, that we are so inclined to believe in the myth of character.

Currie does not resolve this question to his own satisfaction. His defense of character in narrative is that character, as represented in narrative, may serve as an "organizing principle" for other psychologically real states of the persons in the story such as beliefs, desires, and feelings. (215) But he is not entirely sold on this defense, and adds that character skepticism, if accepted, "would make Character-based narratives seem to be either quaintly sentimental tracts or propaganda in support of a dangerously mistaken morality" (216). It is this last possibility that I'd like to comment on, because it deserves a larger discussion.

While, like Currie, I do not think that the evidence in favor of character skepticism is strong or unambiguous enough to call it more than a plausible hypothesis, I agree that it is a hypothesis worth taking seriously. If we assume for the sake of argument, as Currie does, that character skepticism is correct, then a great deal of the moral theorizing about narrative is called into question. For example, Martha Nussbaum ("'Finely Aware and Richly Responsible': Moral Attention and the Moral Task of Literature," The Journal of Philosophy 82 (1985): 516-529) takes the detailed presentation of agents' moral characters in realistic novels like James' The Golden Bowl to be the best possible guide to the development of moral sensitivity and behavior. If character skepticism were vindicated, then Nussbaum's view would be not only wrong, but dangerously so -- no guide to good behavior could be found in these novels if real people bear not the slightest similarity to the persons in the novel.

However, though Currie does not take note of them, there seem to be some possibilities for narrative to make a positive contribution even if character skepticism is correct. If real people lack character, narratives could make a moral contribution by casting light on this fact in various ways. For example, a narrative might offer us agents who seem to have stable character traits, but then strip these traits away, showing their behavior's vulnerability to circumstance. If Currie is right in suspecting that narratives have contributed to building up the myth of character, we could praise those exceptional narratives that tear it down. Non-realistic narrative works may be similarly positioned to make a moral contribution by confounding our (mistaken) expectations that character traits will predict behavior.

It has often been noted that contemporary philosophers have a bias towards a certain type of realistic narrative: among novelists, philosophers love, for example, Tolstoy, James, Eliot, and Dickens. If character skepticism were proved, we would have a strong motivation to counter this bias and to attend to the many narrative works in which character is less important or which implicitly call into question the idea of character. Such works, we could argue, contribute to our understanding of morality. (In fact, even if character skepticism were debunked, an exploration of the contribution of narratives that use character in contra-standard ways is long overdue.)

Currie makes a contribution by noticing this problem and laying out the issues clearly and thoughtfully. The conclusion of Currie's book, rather than solving this problem, serves as an invitation to further thinking about it. The book has many virtues, and the greatest of them might be that it opens up new areas for exploration in the philosophic study of narrative.