Narrow Content

Placeholder book cover

Juhani Yli-Vakkuri and John Hawthorne, Narrow Content, Oxford University Press, 2018, 213pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198785965.

Reviewed by David J. Chalmers, New York University


This important book on narrow content is presented as a third act in what might be called the Twin Earth Wars. At the start of the first act (a long time ago, around 1970) the internalist empire slumbers in dogmatic confidence that the meanings of our words and the contents of our thoughts depend only on what is in the head. In the first act the externalist rebels Hilary Putnam and Tyler Burge deploy Twin Earth thought experiments to argue that meaning and content often depend on matters outside the head. The rebels succeed so well that at this point the externalists become the empire. In the second act, internalist rebels strike back: David Lewis, Frank Jackson, and others argue that even in light of Twin Earth, there is a kind of narrow content that depends on what is inside the head alone. In this third act, the next-generation externalists Juhani Yli-Vakkuri and John Hawthorne aim to strike down internalists on behalf of the empire once and for all, deploying the awesome weapon Mirror Man to give an argument that narrow content is impossible.

I won't leave you in suspense. I think Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne's Mirror Man argument is strong, although not entirely surprising. The argument comes close to establishing what it says it does: notions of narrow content meeting certain familiar constraints (including that narrow contents are always shared between qualitative internal duplicates) are impossible. At the same time, I think the argument has less bearing on issues between internalism and externalism than the authors suggest. For example, it does not establish that content must always depend on the environment. What it really establishes is the falsity of a thesis we might call qualitativism about content (content depends only on qualitative properties), which is largely orthogonal to issues about internalism and externalism. The upshot is not that internalism is false, but rather that internalists should focus on non-qualitative notions of content (as some were doing already). I will try to bring this out in what follows.

There is more to the book than Mirror Man. In the opening chapter, Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne lay out a definition of narrow content with more formal precision than anyone else has done. The second chapter lays out the Mirror Man argument, but it also has an enlightening discussion of truth-conditions and the parameters these may depend on. The third chapter addresses strong forms of internalism, and the fourth chapter focuses on connections between narrow content and rationality. The final two chapters focus on what the authors see as the best options for internalists in light of their arguments. That said, in this review, I will focus especially on the Mirror Man argument that forms the centerpiece and the central thread of the book.

I should say that I am not a neutral reviewer. I am on record as advocating a sort of narrow content, and Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne spend a fair amount of their book arguing against my views. I will spend a little time spelling out how I would respond to their arguments using my own view, but I also hope to give a sense of the philosophical lay of the land more generally.

To recap the history a bit more slowly: Putnam famously asked us to consider Twin Earth, which is just like Earth except that H2O is replaced by the superficially identical substance XYZ. Putnam argued that where we use the term 'water' to refer to H2O, our near-duplicates on Twin Earth use their term 'water' to refer to XYZ. Putnam concluded that the meaning of our words just 'ain't in the head'. Burge asked us to consider another Twin Earth case in which a community uses 'arthritis' for twarthritis, a disease of the muscles. He argued that where someone on Earth believes that someone has arthritis, his duplicate on Twin Earth does not: he believes that someone has twarthritis. Burge concluded that the content of our thoughts is not in the head either.

Most philosophers were convinced by Putnam and Burge that at least many aspects of meaning and content are not in the head. In these cases it seems that duplicates can use corresponding words with different referents, and use corresponding sentences or thoughts with different truth-conditions. Still, a minority argued that there remains a kind of content that is internal, depending on what is in the head alone. Various accounts of narrow content were put forward by Jerry Fodor, Valerie Hardcastle, Brian Loar, Joseph Mendola, Gabriel Segal, Stephen White, and others. Perhaps most prominent in recent years has been a two-dimensional account of content associated with Lewis, Jackson, and the current reviewer. On this account, there is one dimension of content (a function from possible worlds to extensions) that depends on the environment, but there is another dimension of content (a function from centered worlds to extensions) that does not depend on the environment.

The two-dimensional strategy for understanding narrow content in terms of centered worlds is loosely inspired by a sort of descriptivism. Intuitively, a descriptive content such as "the clear, drinkable liquid in my environment" might be associated with 'water'-thoughts on both Earth and Twin Earth. Descriptivism about narrow content has some obvious problems, including Kripke's arguments that reference can come apart from any description, and the fact that the referent of some of the terms involved (e.g. "liquid" and "my") may depend on the environment. It's a long story, but Lewis and other theorists argued that these problems could be avoided on a two-dimensional account where the description is replaced by a function from centered worlds to extensions. Here centered worlds are triples of worlds, individuals, and times, where the individual and the time serve as the "center" of the world. Functions from centered worlds to extensions work in a way akin to indexical descriptions, but their extra parameters and their fineness of grain helps them avoid the problems for descriptivism. The narrow content of 'water' ends up mapping an Earth-centered world to H2O and a Twin-Earth-centered world to XYZ. In this way it looks like Oscar on Earth and Twin Oscar on Twin Earth may share a narrow content.

Enter Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne. They take some shots at the two-dimensional account of narrow content, but their ambitions are broader. They aim to give a general argument that narrow content is impossible. Their primary constraint on narrow content is that it depends only on the intrinsic qualitative properties of the thinker. More specifically, if two thoughts have the same "qualitative agential profile", roughly in that they play corresponding roles in agents who are qualitative duplicates of each other, then those thoughts must have the same narrow content. Their secondary constraint, at least for the notions of narrow content that they are targeting, is that narrow content be a sort of truth-conditional content. Narrow content specifies conditions for the thought to be true (at various indices, which might for example be centered worlds), and the thought will be true iff it is true at the distinguished index (e.g. centered world) that obtains in the environment of the thought.

Their main tool is a thought-experiment involving a symmetrical creature they call Mirror Man, who they say is inspired by an example from Kit Fine's book, Semantic Relationism. (There is also a Loop Lady who plays a less central role.) Mirror Man is a left-right symmetrical human in an asymmetrical environment. Every thought he thinks with his left hemisphere has a corresponding thought in his right hemisphere. Mirror Man has experiences as of two people who look like Kit Fine, one on his left and one on his right. With one hemisphere, he thinks Kit1 is human. With the other hemisphere, he has a symmetrical thought Kit2 is human. In fact, the one on his left is human (so the first thought is true) while the one on his right is a waxwork (so the second thought is false).

Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne then have a simple argument that narrow content (or at least narrow content defined over Lewis-style centered worlds) is impossible. Mirror Man is in effect a duplicate of himself under a mapping that switches left and right. The two thoughts Kit1 is human and Kit2 is human then have the same qualitative agential profile. It follows from the definition of narrow content that if there is narrow content, they have the same narrow content, and therefore the same narrow truth-conditions. However, these two thoughts have different truth-values: the first is true while the second is false. It seems to follow that they have different truth-conditions (at least if the distinguished index for the two thoughts is the same, as it will be on an account where indices are Lewis-style centered worlds). If so, we have a contradiction. There is no assignment of contents to these thoughts that satisfies the constraints on narrow content.

There are a number of ways of reacting to the argument. First, one might follow Kant in arguing that there is some sort of qualitative difference between left and right as physical relations, so that a left glove and a corresponding right glove are not qualitative duplicates of each other. On a view of this sort, Mirror Man's two thoughts will not be qualitative duplicates of each other, and the argument will be blocked. Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne do not consider this sort of view as far as I can tell, although they do consider a corresponding view about the phenomenology of left and right. There they suggest that they could appeal to other sorts of symmetry, such as rotational symmetries in a spherical agent. Perhaps that maneuver would suffice here too.

Second, one can note as above that the main formulation of the Mirror Man argument assumes a Lewis-style centered-worlds account of narrow content, where indices are triples of worlds, individuals, and times. In response one could invoke more fine-grained indices, so that Mirror Man's two thoughts will occur at different indices and the argument against narrowness will be blocked. An obvious strategy is to use thoughts (that is, acts of thinking) as indices, so that the narrow truth-conditions of a thought may include the thought itself as a constituent, perhaps along the lines of <The cause of this very thought is human>. Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne discuss this strategy (which they call thought-relativism) and do not have much to say against it, except that views of this sort are guaranteed to avoid counterexamples. There are worse problems for a view to have! One potentially worse problem arises from conjunctive thoughts (e.g. Kit1 is human and Kit2 is not), which can be hard to reconcile with both narrowness and compositionality. Still, I think strategies of this sort are very much worth investigating (my own internalist account of narrow content is more fine-grained than Lewis's in roughly this way), and I will return to views in this vicinity shortly.

The Mirror Man case may remind readers of the well-known Two Tubes case put forward by David Austin (1988), so it is worth getting clear on the relation between the two. The Two Tubes case involves someone with a symmetrical visual field with visual experiences as of two red dots on the left and the right, thinking That is red (demonstrating an object on the left) and That is red (demonstrating an object on the right), where the first thought is true but the second thought is false. Austin argues plausibly that no view where content is a set of possible worlds (Stalnaker) or a set of centered worlds (Lewis) can handle the Two Tubes case. The Two Tubes case need not involve a wholly symmetrical agent, but there is otherwise a clear structural resemblance to the Mirror Man case. The respective authors put the cases to somewhat different uses, however. Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne use Mirror Man to argue against narrow content or internalism, while Austin never mentions narrow content or internalism, instead targeting specific theories. Furthermore, the Mirror Man case targets contents associated with names and many other expressions, where the Two Tubes case is directed only at contents associated with demonstratives (hence the title of Austin's book, What's the Meaning of 'This'). The common point between the two is that both arguments use symmetry considerations to target Lewis's centered-world account of content, which is the most popular account of narrow content. That said, Hawthorne and Yli-Vakkuri have broader ambitions and their overall anti-internalist argument is more general in its scope.

For what it is worth, I think that both the Two Tubes argument and the Mirror Man argument against a Lewis-style centered-worlds view of narrow content succeed. In my own work, I have taken the moral of the Two Tubes case to be that a two-dimensionalist needs to add more parameters as indices in a centered world. Just as Lewis's famous Two Gods cases suggested that one has to add subjects and times as indices (reflecting a sort of direct reference to oneself and the current time), the Two Tubes case suggests that one has to add something like experiences or thoughts as indices (reflecting a sort of direct reference to one's experiences and thoughts). This leads to a finer-grained variety of centered-worlds content as above. But as I will discuss shortly, it is not clear that the result is a variety of narrow content in the official sense.

For now, let us say that the Mirror Man argument succeeds. What follows? Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne use the argument to make trouble for internalism, understood as the thesis that thoughts have truth-conditional content that depends only on internal qualitative properties. But in fact, there is nothing special about the boundary of skin and skull here, and the same sort of argument can be used to argue for much stronger conclusions.

For example, one can equally make an argument against galacticism, the thesis that thoughts have truth-conditional content that depends only on galactic qualitative properties, those instantiated within the galaxy of the thinker. One need only consider a Mirror Galaxy case involving a symmetrical thinker within a symmetrical galaxy in an asymmetrical universe. Say our thinker thinks Kit1 is being observed and Kit2 is being observed. Here Kit1 and Kit2 are symmetrical humans, where Kit1 is being observed by someone outside the galaxy and Kit2 is being observed by no one. Then the first thought is true and the second thought is false. But the two thoughts are qualitative galactic duplicates. By the same reasoning as in the Mirror Man case, galacticism is false.

Should we conclude that truth-conditional content depends on something outside the galaxy? No doubt it sometimes does, but that would be the wrong conclusion in this case. The truth-values of the thoughts in question depend on something extra-galactic, but the truth-conditions do not seem to. The contents of the two thoughts can be represented as <observed(Kit1)> and <observed(Kit2)>, and there is no clear reason to think that reference to Kit1 or Kit2 or reference to observation involves something extra-galactic. The right conclusion is that here, meaning and content depend on something non-qualitative (or singular) within the galaxy. The difference between the thoughts arises from the non-qualitative numerical difference between Kit1 and Kit2, who may be entirely intra-galactic.

With minor extra assumptions, one can even extend the argument to a Mirror Universe case, establishing the falsity of qualitativism: the thesis that there is truth-conditional content that depends only on qualitative properties of the universe (or more strictly, on the universal qualitative profile of a thought). Say we alter only the extra-galactic elements of the Mirror Galaxy case so that it is a Mirror Universe case in which both Kits are observed. Mirror Man once again thinks Kit1 is being observed and Kit2 is being observed. Unlike the previous case, both thoughts are now true -- but it is plausible that this change is not due to a change in the truth-conditions of the thought, but instead is due to a change in whether the world satisfies those conditions. Given the plausible assumption that each of these two thoughts has the same truth-conditions as in the previous case, it follows that the two thoughts again have different truth-conditional content. But the two thoughts are universal qualitative duplicates. So qualitativism is false. Truth-conditional content does not depend on qualitative properties at all.

Returning to the Mirror Man, what should we conclude from the argument that truth-conditional content does not depend on internal qualitative properties? Should we conclude that it depends partly on external qualitative properties? That would obviously be the wrong conclusion. The reasonable conclusion is that truth-conditional content depends on non-qualitative properties, such as those involving specific objects. The argument is entirely neutral about whether those objects are internal objects, external objects, or both. So the argument as it stands does little to establish externalism over internalism.

There are familiar internalist accounts of content on which content depends on internal singular entities. Take a Russellian descriptivist view on which we make direct reference to sense-data, universals, and the self, and on which all contents are derived from these. The content of an external demonstrative such as "that object" on this view might be something like <the entity that causes sense-datum S>. This can naturally be understood as an internally-grounded content, composed from direct reference to causation (a universal) and S (a specific internal sense-datum). It is not a narrow content in the sense defined earlier, since a duplicate subject would have a different content, e.g. <the entity that causes sense-datum S'>, where S' is a distinct (although qualitatively identical) sense-datum had by the distinct (although qualitatively identical) subject. But this is nevertheless not an externalist view of content -- there need be no environmental dependence here.

The same goes for token-reflexive accounts of content, where the content of a mental token such as Kit may involve that very token -- for example, the content of a token Kit might be <the entity that causes Kit>, or perhaps some much more complex content that nevertheless involves the token. As before, this is not a narrow content, but it is an internal content.

The sort of fine-grained centered-worlds account that I have put forward to address the Two Tubes case also involves this sort of object-dependent internal content. My own framework involves adding a sequence of experiences or thoughts as indices to the center of a world, but the net effect is very much as on the accounts above. In the Mirror Man case, Kit1 refers to an object at least in part in virtue of that object's relation to the token Kit1 (or an associated experience), and Kit2 refers to a distinct object in virtue of its relation to Kit2. This breaks the symmetry. I noted in a 2001 paper and in Constructing the World (2012) that the upshot of this is that the contents in the Two Tubes case are not narrow in the official sense, because they are not shared between duplicates. Still, they certainly do not depend on the environment either.

Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne call views of this sort "quasi-internalism", involving "quasi-narrow contents". The fifth chapter of the book focuses entirely on quasi-internalism, but surprisingly it does not contain any arguments against the view. Instead it is devoted to arguing that it is not clear just why these views should count as internalist, and that various senses in which they may count as internalist are weak senses. Still, I think it is clear to almost anyone that if one of the specific quasi-internalist views described above is correct (say, the Russell-style view or mine, where the only non-narrowness of the contents arises from singular reference to sense-data or experiences), those views are internalist enough to be interesting. There are various robust senses in which these views count at least as anti-externalist: for example, the external objects of thought and the linguistic community play no role in grounding one's having of these contents. If no substantive problems arise for the views, then the opponents of standard externalism can be happy.

The final chapter introduces an internalist variant of Fine's semantic relationism, where thought tokens can stand in co-ordination relations that guarantee they are a priori connected. Along the way, Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne finally give a substantial argument against Russell-style quasi-internalist views of the sort I favor. Their argument involves a biconditional thought Derek Parfit is popular iff Derek Parfit is popular. The worry is that although this thought seems to be a priori, on the Russell-style view it will not be, since there are two distinct tokens of Derek Parfit whose content may differ as the two distinct tokens of Kit do. To avoid this, one needs a way of giving the thoughts the same content.

The Parfit case poses an interesting and nontrivial challenge which (together with the discussion of internalist semantic relationism) advances the debate further than the more familiar considerations in the earlier chapters. A natural way to handle it is to move from tokens to types, akin to word-types in a language of thought. Then the two connected tokens of Derek Parfit will be members of the same type D, and direct reference to D will allow them to have a common content such as <what causes tokens of D>, or a more complex content in which D plays a role. The two unconnected tokens Kit1 and Kit2 will be members of different types K1 and K2 and will have distinct contents along the lines of <what causes tokens of K1> and <what causes tokens of K2>. As a result, the biconditional Parfit-thought will be a priori while the biconditional Fine-thought will not. One could also use tokens rather than types in the content by allowing Fine-style co-ordination relations between these elements to enter the contents.

Of course there is more to be said. Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne raise a number of interesting challenges for Fine-style internalist semantic relationism, and some of these would apply to the view I suggest here. The challenges do not seem insurmountable, though, and there is clearly a research program for internalists to be going on with. Philosophers on both sides of the issue can be grateful to Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne for invigorating a debate that had been threatening to go stale, and for setting an agenda for further work.


Austin, D.F. 1990. What's the Meaning of 'This'? Cornell University Press.

Burge, T. 1979. Individualism and the mental. Midwest Studies in Philosophy 4:73-122.

Chalmers, D.J. 2001. The nature of epistemic space (2001 version).

Chalmers, D.J. 2012. Constructing the World. Oxford University Press.

Fine, K. 2007. Semantic Relationism. Oxford University Press.

Fodor, J. 1987. Psychosemantics. MIT Press.

Hardcastle, V.G. 1990. [Published under "Valerie Walker".] In defense of a different taxonomy: A reply to Owens. Philosophical Review 99:425-431.

Jackson, F. 2003. Narrow content and representation, or Twin Earth revisited. Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 77:55-70.

Loar, B. 1988. Social content and psychological content. In Robert H. Grimm & D. D. Merrill (eds.), Contents of Thought. University of Arizona Press.

Mendola, J. 2008. Anti-Externalism. Oxford University Press.

Putnam, H. 1975. The meaning of 'meaning'. Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science 7:131-193.

Lewis, D. 1979. Attitudes de dicto and de se. Philosophical Review 88:513-43.

Segal, G. 2000. A Slim Book about Narrow Content. MIT Press.

White. S. 1982. Partial character and the language of thought. Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 63:347-65.