Natality and Finitude

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Anne O'Byrne, Natality and Finitude, Indiana University Press, 2010, 201pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253222411.

Reviewed by Serena Parekh, Northeastern University


It is a platitude both within and outside of academic philosophy that philosophers are obsessed with death. As a result, the extraordinary event of birth has been largely ignored. There are many reasons why birth -- and its philosophical counterpart, natality -- have not been given as much philosophical attention as death. For one, it is often seen as something merely bodily, natural, and, consequently, unworthy of philosophical reflection (8). Feminists might point out that because bearing children is done by women, this activity and its philosophical significance has been ignored by philosophers who have traditionally been men. As someone who has recently had a baby, I think one reason birth may be under-theorized is because it is so overwhelming -- there is so much to do to care for the completely vulnerable creature that is born, and so many anxieties that attach to this activity, that philosophical speculation, which requires time, distance, and focus, seems almost impossible. Yet despite these philosophical, political, and practical reasons, Anne O'Byrne presents a strong case for why birth and natality ought to play a fundamental role in our thinking about our own existence, temporality, and finitude. Indeed, it is a bold challenge to philosophers of all stripes to take up natality in their philosophical thinking.

Her argument revolves around the relevance of natality for our understanding and experience of finitude. As natal beings, "our finitude is brought home to us in the recognition that there was once a time when we were not, that we owe our existence to others, and that those others are nevertheless not the ground of our being" (7). Philosophers like Lucretius have argued that death is significant because it lies before us, while birth is insignificant because what happened before is of no concern to us. O'Byrne turns this kind of thinking on its head by forcefully arguing for the view that birth, natality, reveals our finitude in a unique and complex way. One of the strongest contributions of this book is to show the ontological significance of natality for the way we experience finitude -- something that has been neglected by most of philosophy.

A second major contribution of her book is the argument that natality's philosophical significance lies in the fact that it makes clear an ontological dimension of our existence, one that, again, has been under appreciated. This is that natality, birth, reveals us as being in relation to another. Death, by contrast, individualizes us -- ultimately everyone goes to her death alone. Birth, however, always takes place in relation to another: the parents who created the life, the maternal body, and ultimately the set of relations that come to define who we are as individuals.

Although natality has been largely under-theorized, it has not been completely ignored. O'Byrne argues that four philosophers -- Heidegger, Dilthey, Arendt, and Nancy -- have developed the concept in significant ways. Her analysis seeks to clarify their discussions and point out the ways in which their views might be expanded and refined to improve our understanding of natality. In so doing, O'Byrne manages to develop unique readings of each author, as well as present one of the most sustained discussions of natality available.

O'Byrne begins with Heidegger and argues that he can be credited with the inception of natal thinking in the twentieth century. This is surprising, of course, since Heidegger's name tends to be almost synonymous with popularizing the importance of death for authentic existence. Nonetheless, for O'Byrne the concept of thrownness can be seen as a precursor to natality; indeed, she argues that his discussion of thrownness is one of the best-sustained considerations of natality. Our condition of thrownness, she argues, situates us as historical beings and introduces us to a world that is not of our own making and to a past that we have the impossible task of making our own (5-6). Unfortunately, Heidegger quickly subsumes natality under the future-oriented being-towards-death, and our natality, the fact that we are thrown into the world at birth, is overshadowed by our thrownness towards death. "For the most part, Heidegger conserves the deeply established philosophical fascination with death that has made it all but impossible to see natal finitude" (16). In other words, though Heidegger pioneers and introduces natal thinking, it is quickly obscured by the more traditional concern for death. O'Byrne then turns to other thinkers -- Arendt, Nancy, and Dilthey -- who take up the task of thinking about the existential significance of natality that Heidegger initiated.

As O'Byrne reads him, one of Dilthey's main projects is to find the meaning of the various parts of our existence, and to find the meaning of parts, we must find the meaning of the whole. "Dilthey is committed to the thought that access to a whole is essential if we are to uncover meaning in any particular instance" (47). This is where natality comes to play a crucial role in his thought. The natal character of life reveals its newness and contingency, and thus explains why we are not able to grasp life as a unity or a totality. As such, the meaning of our life always remains a problem. That life can never be understood as a seamless whole or totality informs much of his philosophy and particularly his insistence that the human being cannot be understood as an inert object of scientific investigation. But it is the concept of generation where O'Byrne finds his most important contribution to natality. After elucidating his concept of generation -- which is in fact a constellation of concepts -- O'Byrne argues that "Dilthey provides a structure for understanding how we embodied, natal singulars are toward and with each other" (49). His concept of generation allows us to see natal finitude as embodied, social, historical and political, thus enriching the concept of natality that Heidegger had stumbled upon.

O'Byrne next turns to the work of Hannah Arendt, who, she argues, "has done more to develop a thinking of natality than anyone else" (78). She is concerned with extracting an account of finitude from her understanding of natality, something which Arendt herself did not do. She argues that though Arendt is silent about finitude, finitude is what "unites the questions of mortality, immortality, and natality in her historical narrative" (80). Further, she notes that for Arendt the meaning of finitude changes through the different periods she discusses; we do not share the same understanding of finitude as Pericles, even though we are both natal beings. O'Byrne demonstrates that natality takes on its meaning in a particular age (modern, Middle, Platonic, Pre-Socratic Greece) only in conjunction with mortality, immortality, temporality, and finitude. She develops an original reading of Arendt by arguing that Arendt has four separate accounts of natality, where each account differs in the way that it is bound up with these other categories.

Another innovative aspect of this chapter is her careful reading of natality and its relationship to animal laborans, the term Arendt uses to discuss the condition of labor that has come to dominate the human condition in modernity. Given the rise of animal laborans, it would appear that natality would be reduced to the merely biological fact of birth, and thus lack any existential significance. However, O'Byrne shows that this common reading of Arendt is too facile and does not take seriously the way that natality comes to have meaning in this period. O'Byrne reminds us that, for Arendt, natality is embodied in action, and this in turn ensures that the human condition remains unpredictable; the ultimate meaning of action (and the fact of our birth) can never be fully closed off. Further, the temporality of natality reflects that of action: the meaning of an action can only be known after the fact, and likewise, the meaning of my birth comes long after this event. She refers to this as the syncopated temporality of natality: "We come to be and later turn out to have once not yet been" (103). This is the root of our understanding of ourselves as finite beings, beings who are first embodied, natal, and relational, and who can derive meaning from this only later.

The "Afterword" of the book, "What Will the Clone Make of Us?" is one of the most fascinating parts of her study and ties together a number of themes which run throughout the book. Because she is able to situate her analysis vis-à-vis the very contemporary challenge of human cloning, this chapter shows us the larger consequences of what is at stake in our understanding of natality and finitude. She asks in what way will cloning, a potentially radical change to the human condition, affect natality and, consequently, our experience of finitude? In other words, she hopes that by investigating the existential dimensions of cloning we will be able to see the ontological assumptions we make about our natal being.

What O'Byrne has been arguing through the book, in her readings of Heidegger, Nancy, Dilthey, and Arendt, is that what makes us who we are is our natal material existence as it occurs in relation to others (151). If a clone were to be considered a copy of us, however, it would be because personhood was conceived as biological (i.e., having human DNA) and thus pose a challenge to her view. O'Byrne forcefully argues that the clone would not be a copy of us because its embodied relation to others would be different from ours. The clone would be distinct from us because she would grow up in a world that is created, populated, and shaped by us, by our generation. It is this set of relations and the existential anxieties that it produces that mark the fundamental difference from us, not biological material; there will never be anyone, including clones, who are not always already in relation to others and will be able to ask, why was I born? "Clone or not, the newness of the newborn is inevitable" (161). This newness, as O'Byrne has shown, demands an existential response.

Her analysis of cloning highlights the two main points that I took away from her book. First, the point above demonstrates nicely the importance of the idea that natality reveals that we are always in relation to others, even before we can relate to ourselves. Understanding who we are -- the existential dimension of our being -- thus becomes inextricably linked to natality. Second, that our natality is profoundly important for our experience of finitude is expressed through O'Byrne's analysis of the anxiety around cloning. O'Byrne articulates this as the anxiety that the meaning of our lives will not be a task to be achieved by us, in relation to others, but it will be a given, determined by our biology. It reveals our "natal fear that meaning will be completed and there will never be the chance to begin again" (163). O'Byrne makes a compelling case that it is this existential anxiety which is at the heart of our concern around cloning, and this in turn reveals even more strongly the importance of natality for our finitude and the meaning of our lives.

What O'Byrne writes of Arendt is also true of her own work: "what is at stake in the various construals of natality is knowing, specifically our capacity to understand ourselves as mortal or immortal or natal beings" (96). If the task of philosophy is to understand ourselves and this crucial dimension -- our birth -- has been long undeveloped, then O'Byrne's book is not only a contribution to our scholarly understanding of the concept of natality or the philosophers she discusses; it is also a contribution towards understanding who we are in the deepest way. For those reasons, this thoughtful, erudite, and beautifully written book is an important contribution.