Natural Kinds and Genesis: The Classification of Material Entities

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Stewart Umphrey, Natural Kinds and Genesis: The Classification of Material Entities, Lexington, 2016, 173pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498531412.

Reviewed by Jonathan Davies, University of Exeter


This monograph aims to set out and defend a realist position about natural kinds. Stewart Umphrey’s argument touches on a range of traditional metaphysical topics, as well as exploring the role of natural-kinds thinking in the sciences. His aim is to defend the claim that there exist “irreducibly thick particulars of the sort presupposed in everyday life” with at least some of these “belong[ing] to natural kinds in virtue of their essences; and that these kinds, as types, are real substantive universals” (p. 41). The general pattern of argumentation is to lay out a range of possible objections to Umphrey’s various realisms, and to suggest that, on balance, we are justified in accepting that there are in fact natural kinds and the particulars that constitute them. The book features some innovations that will be of interest to those engaged in the defence of natural-kinds realism (and their opponents), however I suggest that there is little here to change the minds of those unpersuaded of its merits.

Umphrey frames his thesis around two central questions; “What is a natural kind?” and “Which, if any, are the natural kinds?” Drawing on Kripke (2001) and Putnam (1975), he begins with our prescientific intuitions that there exist (independently of our interests or views) discrete kinds of objects (e.g. water and squirrels). The early chapters, then, explore what it is to be a realist about these kinds and what it takes to be a member of a natural kind. Central to Umphrey’s conception is that members of natural kinds are continuants, and that continuants are beings-in-becoming characterised by a particular (essential) mode of interaction with the world. When it comes to addressing the second question Umphrey calls on the scientific essentialism of Brian Ellis (2001) to defend the claims that there are in fact natural kinds and that natural-kinds thinking plays a part in the sciences. However, where Umphrey departs from Ellis is in his account of continuants. As a result, he argues for a more restricted role for natural-kinds thinking in chemistry than Ellis suggests. Indeed it seems that there are rather few actual natural kinds, and they turn out not to be what we generally think they are.

In Chapter 2 Umphrey sets out what he takes to be our natural attitude to the world. We are disposed to think of the world as including entities that fall into natural (as well as non-natural) kinds. Umphrey presents a brief review of possible attitudes towards the reality (observer-(in)dependence) of the natural world. His responses to a range of anti-realist arguments are presented and, finding these arguments surmountable, he is able to defend our commons sense natural attitude and the value of rooting our metaphysics in this attitude. It is on this basis that Umphrey develops the details of his account.

In order to defend a robust realism about natural kinds as types Umphrey must establish, not only that there are real entities possessed of a nature or essence (i.e. irreducibly thick particulars), but also that there are universals. It is to a defence of both these position that he turns in Chapter 3. The account of universals is kept deliberately general, and Umphrey only tentatively accepts the thesis that: “There are universals, i.e. non-spatiotemporal multiply-exemplifiable entities which are somehow in or beyond the spatiotemporal things which exemplify them” (p. 36). As well as remaining agnostic about the relation between universals and particulars, Umphrey accepts this thesis on the basis that we cannot adjudicate between the arguments pro and con. Similarly, the defence of the existence of thick particulars is left, at this stage, very tentative. It is in Chapter 4 on the notion of a continuant that Umphrey hopes to flesh out his account of particulars and so provide support for his realism about particulars. It is here that he also begins to explain his essentialism.

A continuant is a thick particular that endures through change and that is characterised by a peculiar form of engagement with the world. Umphrey distinguished three grades of “involvement”:

Grade I: a thing’s variation, multiplicity, or dependence on other natural things is extrinsic to the thing itself.

Grade II, on the other hand, is autonomous in that its variation and invariance, multiplicity and unity, or dependence and independence on/from other natural things is intrinsic to the thing itself.

Grade III: a thing’s invariance, unity or independence is extrinsic to the thing itself.

The intrinsic character of the metabolic, compositional or situational involvement of a continuant with the world is what renders it in possession of an essence or nature and so, in turn, what makes it a member of a natural kind. Like Kripke, Umphrey identifies micro-features as the essence of the thing. However Umphrey emphasises the dynamic processes that underlie a continuant’s variation or stability, rather than stable structural constituents, as the key to grasping this nature. It is the form of becoming that makes a continuant what it is and so, what allows us to identify it as a token of a natural-kind type. Umphrey maintains the Strawsonian demand that continuants be discrete, enduring and re-identifiable. This latter requirement, along with the autonomy of its involvement with the world, leads Umphrey to reject many of the usual candidates for membership of natural kinds. Electrons, for example, are rejected as continuants due to their lack of compositional involvement with the world. There are also problems with including many living things (Umphrey notes problems with identifying the boundaries of organisms as well as the problem of re-identifying them over time). The chapter concludes with, once again, a tentative acceptance of realism on the basis of the irresolvability of the metaphysical arguments: “given our remarkable ability to single out and track some continuant-like objects, an ability that skeptics have not shown to be spurious, it seems reasonable to accept tentatively the realist alternative. Let us do so.” (p. 67)

It is in Chapter 5 that Umphrey presents his answer to the question of what it is to be a natural kind:

A natural kind . . . is a class whose members are all and only those continuants that exemplify, in virtue of their essences or natures, a single type. Alternatively, a natural kind is a type whose tokens are all and only those continuants that exemplify it in virtue of their essences or natures, and that constitute, therefore, a single natural class. (p. 71)

In defence of his realism about such kinds Umphrey, again, pursues the strategy of cataloguing the realist and antirealist positions available to us. He accepts the thesis that there are natural-kind classes (and perhaps types) on the basis of our ability to discern them. There is a great deal of agreement about what universals are instantiated by particulars and we have the ability to track continuants through their transformations. Here, however he finds the resources of common-sense (pre-scientific) naturalism inadequate to the task of shoring up his realism. Exactly what natural kinds are there? Answering this question requires more that the common-sense realism he has so-far outlined and so, in chapters 6 and 7, he turns to the natural sciences and the scientific essentialism of Ellis.

In common with Ellis, Umphrey finds his exemplary natural kinds in chemistry, although the usual examples that are used by essentialists turn out not to be suitable candidates. For example, the heteronomy of the molecular constituents of quantities of water prevents Umphrey from ascribing natural kind status to water as it appears in nature. The same will be the case for any “heap” of an element or compound that we might experience in nature. Neither can bodies of water be considered continuants. Ensembles, such as “water”, “gold” etc. are, he argues, compositionally grade III (they lack the autonomy of involvement with the world required for grade II involvement). Hence they do not have essences in virtue of which they can be members of natural kinds. It is to free particles (atoms/molecules) of such elements and compounds that Umphrey looks for the genuine continuants. So molecules belong to the same kind if and only if they (1) have the same constituents, (2) have the same “structure” and (3) are considered in isolation from the ensembles in which they are generally found (i.e. are “free”). Umphrey discussed the complications with the notion of the structure of H2O and emphasises the dynamic nature of molecular bonding, but asserts that the similarity relations are good enough to classify all and only H2O molecules as belonging to a natural kind (the class of H2O molecules, presumably, but it seems we cannot call this class “water” for the reasons spelled out in his rejection of the claim that mass terms pick out natural kinds).

In the case of biology natural-kinds realism has been the target of much recent criticism (e.g. Dupré 1993). Umphrey is acutely aware of the difficulties here and his defence of a (very) limited role for natural-kinds thinking in biology is accordingly tentative. He considers whether species could be continuants, and rejects this on the basis of the problems of identifying their boundaries and of re-identification. At the genetic level candidates for continuants are considered and rejected on similar grounds. Therefore it is to organisms that we must look, but what natural-kind classes do organisms fall into?

Genealogical species concepts are poor candidate for natural kinds, however Umphrey wishes to keep open the possibility that typological species concepts could pick out similarities that are good enough to qualify as a natural kinds. The similarities he points to are, in accord with this general account of continuants, related to the becoming (genesis) of the entity. Cases of paraphyly, hydridization and polyploidy are considered in order to suggest that there is a theoretical role for a natural-kinds species concept. The similarity that amounts to a common essence in these cases is of a body plan, a pattern of development that can be identified as essential to the being of the organism.

What is significant here is that, in common with the example taken from chemistry, Umphrey’s efforts to shore up his realism about natural kinds point to features that confound our common-sense notions. If we take the case of a squirrel (one of the examples used to illustrate our natural attitude) it is not clear that we can claim it is a member of a natural kind in any straightforward sense. Is “squirrel” a natural kind? Umphrey seems to want to say yes, but his rejection of historical essence (he asserts that natural kinds are essentially typological) and problems with mapping species concepts onto observed organisms by means of typological classification, mean that identifying what it is about the class of “squirrels” that satisfies the demands of natural-kind-dom is very difficult, and certainly not commonsensical. Similarly with the class of H2O molecules, the identification of their common essence takes us a long way from our intuitions. So Umphrey says this about existent natural kinds:

To judge from our survey of physical and biological theories, they include the class whose members are all and only hydrogen atoms, provided they are isotopic; the class whose members are all and only H2O molecules, provided they are essentially isomorphic as well as isometric; and perhaps even a class whose members are polyploidal organisms belonging to the species Galax urceolata, or beetleweed, provided they resemble one another in virtue of their natures. These kinds are of little interest to practicing chemists and biologists or taxonomists, and they are not among the kinds regarded as exemplary in everyday thought and speech (p. 136, emphasis mine).

This latter admission seems to lead to a problem of motivation. We are asked, on the basis of our everyday intuitions and our prescientific ability to discern (successfully one supposes) natural kinds, to agree that there are (on balance) good reasons for thinking that there are continuants that fall into natural-kind classes. However the admitted lack of success in “everyday thought and speech” in picking out and naming existing natural kinds undercuts the argument for settling the unresolved metaphysical dispute in favour of our natural attitude. The latter enquiry into the question of what natural kinds there are is, in turn, unmotivated. Umphrey notes that, “as science has progressed, more and more natural-kind terms have fallen into the conceptual wastebasket of history” (p. 5). It seems that we could read Umphrey’s book as another rear-guard action in the ongoing retreat of natural-kind realism, abandoning electrons and squirrels along the way.


Dupré, J. 1993. The Disorder of Things: Metaphysics Foundations of the Disunity of Science. Harvard University Press.

Ellis, B. 2001. Scientific Essentialism. Cambridge University Press.

Kripke, S. 1980. Naming and Necessity. Blackwell.

Putnam, H. 1975. Mind, Language and Reality: Philosophical Papers, Vol. 2. Cambridge University Press.