Natural Law and Practical Rationality

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Murphy, Mark, Natural Law and Practical Rationality, Cambridge University Press, 2001, xiv + 284 pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-521-80229-6.

Reviewed by Timothy Chappell, University of Dundee, Scotland


Actions can be worth doing, or not worth doing, or worth not doing. A complete explanation of what gives one of these statuses to any possible action (or action-type) would be a complete theory of practical rationality. Though Mark Murphy’s objective is explicitly not completeness (section 0.2), what his fine book offers is a fairly detailed picture of one such theory.

A theory of practical rationality could take a number of possible forms. Commonsense morality, for instance, says that actions are worth doing if they achieve something of obvious positive value, worth not doing if they achieve something of obvious negative value, and not worth doing if they achieve nothing much either way. Utilitarians say that actions are worth doing if and only if they maximize utility; otherwise they are worth not doing (and they are also not worth doing). And Kantians say that actions are worth doing if they are done from the motive of Duty and their maxims are consistent with the Categorical Imperative; not worth doing if their maxims are consistent with the Categorical Imperative but they are not done from the motive of Duty; and worth not doing if their maxims are not consistent with the Categorical Imperative.

While Murphy’s discussion of practical rationality has something to say about all these possibilities (see, e.g., pp. 162-172), his own approach is the natural-law approach to practical rationality. The best-known writers in the contemporary natural law school are John Finnis (Fundamentals of Ethics and Natural Law and Natural Rights), Germain Grisez (Living a Christian Life and Christian Moral Principles), and the authors collected in Robert George’s volume Natural Law Theory. More recently there are David Oderberg’s two books Moral Theory and Applied Ethics, my own Understanding Human Goods, and a number of other books and articles.

As Murphy himself describes his project, “What I want to do in this book is to make a case for a particular naturalist, objectivist, cognitivist, welfarist, anti-particularist, anti-consequentialist view—which, it turns out, is a version of natural law theory as traditionally understood” (p. 5). Like other natural law theorists, Murphy begins by positing a range of basic goods. Agents have reasons because they have reasons to pursue, participate in, and protect these goods, and reasons to avoid damaging them, acting against them, or violating them. Murphy’s theory is welfarist because the basic goods are “aspects of human flourishing.” It is naturalist because what counts as human flourishing is settled by the order of the natural world. It is objectivist because what counts as human flourishing is not merely a matter of opinion, and not deeply relative to time or place. It is cognitivist because there are knowable facts about what counts as human flourishing. It is anti-particularist because it rejects the idea that the basic goods give us no types of reasons that can reliably be generalized. And it is anti-consequentialist, because for two reasons, it denies that any action is right if and only if it has the best consequences. (The first reason is Murphy’s denial that only consequences matter to the evaluation of actions. The second is Murphy’s view that consequences often have incommensurable values, because consequences, like other states of affairs, are inter alia instantiations of the basic goods, and the basic goods are incommensurable.)

This gives the reader a picture of the whole project of the book. In the rest of this review, I shall offer some closer remarks about three points that particularly struck me. These points happen to be from the first three chapters. I’ll take them in turn.

In Chapter One, “The Real Identity Thesis”, Murphy addresses the question of how we know what the basic goods are. The two answers that he considers are derivationism and inclinationism. Derivationism says (roughly) that what the human goods are is a zoological question, the answer to which is derived from scientific observation of the human species. Inclinationism says (roughly) that what the human goods are is a hermeneutical question, to be answered by reflection on immediately and underivedly knowable facts about our own inclinations. The Real Identity Thesis, which Murphy defends, is the thesis that derivationism and inclinationism are different routes to the same conclusions: “The states of affairs grasped by practical reason as ‘x is a good to be pursued’ are identical with those states of affairs grasped by theoretical reason as ‘x is an aspect of human flourishing’” (p.40).

This conclusion faces two obvious objections. The first is that there seem to be goods that have nothing to do with human flourishing. The natural environment provides one type of example. The well-being of the rich ecology of Amazonia is a state of affairs that practical reason grasps as to be pursued, but there is no reason to think that this to-be-pursuedness has anything essential to do with our flourishing. That Amazonia should flourish is a good in its own right, quite apart from human goods. Closer to home for a theist like Murphy, God looks like another example. Christians don’t worship God because it makes their lives go well to worship him; they worship him simply because he is worthy of worship. A parallel point can be made elsewhere, for example in the experience of art. This undermines Murphy’s thesis that the set of goods to be pursued is identical with the set of aspects of human flourishing.

A second objection to Murphy’s thesis is the familiar point that my human flourishing, understood purely in the terms of evolutionary biology, can easily seem to conflict with your human flourishing. The more food there is for me, the less there is for you; the more I propagate my gene pool, the less you can propagate yours. The correct retort to this objection is, surely, that there is more to human beings (and consequently to human flourishing) than evolutionary biology recognizes. But if we make that move, our account of human flourishing cannot claim to be purely theoretical—purely based upon what strict science tells us. A fuller picture of human flourishing will need to talk about culture, art, religion, politics, the nature of friendship, and so on. And to be anything better than hopelessly vague and indeterminate in its implications for ethics, it will need to do so in a way that discriminates good cultural, artistic, and religious arrangements from bad ones—a task which is patently ultra vires for human zoology. None of this discredits Murphy’s idea that at least some of the data for what counts as human flourishing comes from science. (Someone else who has argued powerfully for that idea is Philippa Foot, most recently in her book Natural Goodness. I have defended it myself in Philosophical Quarterly 1998.) But it does undermine the idea that there is a sharp contrast to be drawn between the “theoretical” and “practical” routes to an account of human flourishing.

Murphy’s second chapter defends objectivism about the nature of well-being from various sorts of subjectivism. Murphy seems mistaken to me to claim that “the prevailing philosophical orthodoxy concerning welfare is… subjectivist” (p.46). Still, subjectivism about welfare is clearly prevalent enough to be worth attacking, and Murphy’s attack on it is characteristically ingenious and subtle. His strategy is to distinguish simple desire-fulfillment theories (which say that well-being is measured by the degree of fulfillment of your actual desires) from knowledge-modified desire-fulfillment theories (which say that well-being is measured by the degree of fulfillment of whatever your desires would be if you were fully informed). He then argues (fairly conventionally) that the simple desire-fulfillment theory is implausible—but (much less conventionally) that the knowledge-modified theory is even more implausible, because the knowledge-modified theory individuates desires in the wrong way.

Suppose you want an autographed baseball, and falsely believe that this baseball is autographed, and so want this baseball. The knowledge-modified theorist’s standard objection to the simple theory is that the simple theory has to say that getting this baseball fulfills your desires, even though it isn’t signed. So the simple theory has to say that getting this baseball increases your well-being, even though you wouldn’t want it if you knew that it wasn’t actually signed, and won’t want it any more once you realize that. Murphy points out (p. 58) that this objection to the simple theory fails. The simple theory is not committed to saying that getting this baseball fulfills any of your desires; for the simple theory need not say that you have a desire to get this baseball. Whether or not it says that depends on whether we count every motivation as a desire. But we are by no means obliged to do so; indeed, it is possible that a regress will ensue if we do that. If I desire to eat toast, and think that this is toast, then certainly I am motivated to eat this. But there seems to be little point in adding that I also desire to eat this—and the addition is positively unhelpful if we also hold the view that every desire leads to a motivation. This argument is striking, plausible, and, so far as I know, original.

Murphy’s third chapter defends a catalogue of nine basic goods: life, knowledge, aesthetic experience, excellence in play and work, excellence in agency, inner peace, friendship and community, religion, and happiness (pp.101-135). (We only need to glance at this list to see how far Murphy is in practice from deriving his list of goods using “theoretical”, i.e. non-normative, resources.) His list bears interesting comparison with the lists of goods presented by Grisez and Finnis. Like their lists, Murphy’s list does not contain quite what we would have expected it to contain, if it was really produced—as it is said to be—mainly by attending critically to the sorts of reasons that rational human agents actually take as basic. (How often, in practice, do reasonable people do things for the sake of excellence in agency?)

Also like Grisez’ and Finnis’s lists, Murphy’s list of basic goods oddly omits any reference to either pleasure or pain. It’s hard to think of any clearer cases of “immediately intelligible” (p.101) action than these two: (i) My head aches, so I take an aspirin; (ii) I love the smell of coffee; so on my way past the coffee shop, I step inside for a moment to enjoy the smell, and then walk straight out again without buying anything. The moral of (i) is that the avoidance of pain is a fundamental reason for action if anything is; the moral of (ii) is that the pursuit of pleasure is a fundamental reason for action if anything is. Nonetheless, every major member of the orthodox “Grisez School” is committed to rejecting both these morals. What’s more, they seem unnaturally determined to avoid them. (Grisez’ arguments on this topic are well below his usual standards: he is driven, for instance, to the desperate suggestion that our only reason to avoid pain is because pain impairs inner peace (Christian Moral Principles, p.121), an obviously back-to-front suggestion. Grisez also suggests (loc. cit.) that admitting pain and pleasure as basic goods will tend to make each of us self-absorbed. But patently, what makes me self-absorbed is not that I care about pleasure and pain, but that I only care about my pleasure and my pain, and am indifferent to yours.)

This willingness to do whatever is necessary to avoid treating pleasure and pain in the obvious and natural way—as basic goods—is a striking and puzzling phenomenon. Unfortunately, Murphy is part of it. Murphy’s first move is to dispose of pleasure by invoking an Aristotelian account of pleasure, which makes pleasure adverbially related to the activity—golf, philosophy, or whatever—in which pleasure is taken (p.97). We can then reasonably say that there is no separate category of pleasure in such cases: rather, the pleasure is just part of one’s participation in some other basic good (play in the case of golf, knowledge in the case of philosophy). While this is perfectly feasible with golf, philosophy, and other adverbial pleasures, it doesn’t work at all with my coffee-shop case, or other sensational pleasures. It would indeed be a misdescription of the golfer to say that he plays a game of golf for the sake of the pleasure of a game of golf, rather than for the sake of a game of golf. But it is not a misdescription of the man in the coffee shop to say that he is in there for the sake of the pleasure of the smell of coffee, rather than for the sake of the smell of coffee.

Murphy does not address this point about sensational pleasure, but he does address the parallel point about sensational pain. Against the thesis that the avoidance of sensational pain is a basic good, his first point is that it doesn’t fit the usual pattern for basic goods, which are otherwise all cases of “fullness of being, actualized potency”, and their opposites of “emptiness, privation” (p.97). As Murphy realizes, this response won’t do: on its own, it just prompts the retort “so much the worse for the usual pattern.” So he tries something else (pp.98-99):

It must be the desire to avoid the pain that generates the reason to avoid it. There are, of course, some who hold that one has reason to avoid pain even if one has no desire to avoid it… on the ground that it is simply the sort of sensation that one has reason to avoid. [But] to hold that one would have a reason to avoid sensations of pain even if one did not desire to avoid them would be as puzzling to me as to hold that one has a reason to avoid a sensation of blueness even if one does not desire to avoid it.

I just can’t see why Murphy finds this idea so “puzzling”. All we need ask is: Is it a bad thing, in itself, to be in pain? If the answer is “Yes” (and the answer patently is “Yes”), then it is already apparent that pain, in itself, gives us a reason to avoid it. But that is all we need to show that we have a basic reason to avoid pain. (Contrast the question “Is it a bad thing, in itself, to have a sensation of blueness?”)

Notwithstanding these critical points about some of Murphy’s theses, it should be put on record that Murphy’s book is a feast of argument. Anyone with a serious interest in contemporary ethics, whatever their own orientation, should accept the invitation to partake.