Natural Law and the Nature of Law

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Jonathan Crowe, Natural Law and the Nature of Law, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 263pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108498302.

Reviewed by Emad H. Atiq, Cornell University


Natural law theorists contend that legal and moral normativity are closely linked. Roughly, facts about what we legally ought to do -- what legal duties and permissions persons have -- are partly grounded in facts about what we morally ought to do.

Natural law theory confronts a host of challenges. One class of challenges is metaethical. The natural law theorist needs to explain what moral facts are, the grounds in virtue of which they have the content that they have, and how we derive from the moral facts prescriptions for the kind of fine-grained practical dilemmas that arise under law. Critics of natural law theory view the moral domain with considerable suspicion (cf. Austin 1832, Kelsen 1960). The dialectical background invites a demystification of morality.

A second class of challenges is metalegal. Natural law theory has historically been associated with legal implications widely seen as counterintuitive. It seems platitudinous that the law's requirements can be radically unjust: persons don't always have moral duties to obey the law, a community's complete ignorance of the moral facts would prevent such facts from determining the content of its laws. Yet natural law theory, classically conceived, seems to imply the opposite: unjust laws aren't laws (Aquinas Summa theologiae); persons have a robust moral duty to obey the law (Finnis 2011); moral principles can generate locally applicable law regardless of whether the relevant principles are transparent to the law's subjects (cf. Dworkin 1986). The natural law theorist needs to either explain why ordinary legal intuition is radically misleading or else show that the theory's implications are not nearly so revisionary (Atiq forthcoming).

In his book, Jonathan Crowe takes up both sets of challenges in the course of developing a novel form of natural law theory. In the first half he addresses the metaethical challenge. In chapters 1 and 2, we're told the moral facts consist in facts about what is good and facts about how we ought to act in relation to the good. Something is basically good if and because humans are characteristically disposed to pursue it and judge it to be good. We ought to engage with the basic goods just as we would under conditions of full imaginative acquaintance with the basic goods. Crowe derives specific duties and obligations from this general account of goodness and right action. Given ideal conditions of imaginative engagement with the basic goods, we would pursue a range of goods ourselves while also not interfering with others' pursuit of the goods (chapter 3). We would recognize the necessity of contributing to a social order that effectively coordinates our individual efforts to promote human flourishing (chapter 4). And the ideal social order would afford the state a minimal role in securing a baseline set of constraints on individual action while deferring to families, localities, and decentralized market-based structures to establish norms for agents, because this familiar scheme of social organization is most likely to promote human flourishing generally (chapters 5 and 6).

The second half of the book responds to the metalegal challenge. Crowe insists that the essential connection between legal and moral facts poses no threat to legal commonsense. After going through various formulations of the fundamental natural law thesis, Crowe settles on: the moral (and rational) defects of a norm or rule render it legally defective, and, in some cases, render it altogether legally invalid (chapter 7). The philosophical task is to explain why the moral defectiveness of a rule relates to its legality in this way. Crowe explains that (a) law is an artifact and (b) it lies in the nature of artifactual kinds to have a function which determines a standard of goodness for instances of the kind.

Chapter 8 develops a general theory of artifacts, according to which something counts as an artifact K only if it is collectively accepted as being a K while being constitutively capable of meeting the success conditions for Ks as defined by their function. Chapter 9 applies the theory to law. We're told law as an artifact has the essential function of generating social acceptance. Accordingly, the injustice or irrationality of a law renders it defective qua law by undermining its effectiveness at generating a robust sense of obligation amongst persons. Rules that are so radically unjust or irrational to be constitutively incapable of attracting social compliance may fail to be law altogether. But such radical failures are likely to be rare. Various commonsensical implications follow. Since nothing counts as an instance of an artifactual kind without being generally recognized as such, free-floating wholly ignored morally good rules cannot be law. There is also no general moral duty to comply with the law, since there are far too many morally (and hence legally) defective laws that remain capable of performing law's function (chapter 10). Finally, chapters 11 and 12 explore the implications for judges tasked with figuring out the law. In deriving legal content from written texts, judges should maximize the likelihood that the articulated law effectively serves the function of law: social compliance, which means privileging the ordinary contextual meaning of written texts while not ignoring the moral reasonableness of the derived rules.

Crowe develops these ideas in detail while usefully bringing natural law theory into contact with important issues in metaethics, normative ethics, and legal theory. It is an ambitious project and the book is well-written. An unwelcome consequence of the project's breadth, however, is that Crowe is unable to adequately engage with the full range of familiar objections one might levy against his positions on contested questions in moral and legal philosophy. Yet Crowe's instincts on the fundamental questions are attractive; and the appeal of the overall package of commitments constitutes an argument for it, even if the devil is in the details. In what follows, I offer some targeted commentary on key aspects of Crowe's metaethics and his theory of legality.

The nature of the good and the right

In chapters 1 through 3, Crowe aims to provide a "naturalistic account of value" (p. 34). The evaluative facts are grounded in our "normative inclinations," defined as the basic drives and dispositions to find ends valuable that are causally dependent on our biological nature and the social context in which we find ourselves. The fact that pleasure is good, for example, is partly grounded in the fact that humans are characteristically driven to pursue pleasure for its own sake and judge it to be good in a wide variety of social and historical contexts.

While Crowe relies on the grounding idiom, the natural facts are sometimes portrayed as having a mere epistemic significance: "It is not that the basic goods are valuable for humans because humans are disposed to value them; rather the fact that humans are disposed to value the goods provides evidence of their value for humans" (p. 33). The epistemic connection seems too weak to support Crowe's goal of providing an "explanatory theory" of the basic goods, one that "entails that normativity is in some way natural" (p. 34). If it isn't in virtue of our dispositions to value pleasure that pleasure is good, the metaphysical question remains unanswered: in virtue of what is pleasure good? The epistemic connection itself cries out for a deeper explanation: in virtue of what do our drives and evaluative dispositions constitute evidence for evaluative truth? In general, I found the relationship between the evaluative and the natural to be undertheorized. Moreover, a thorough de-mystification of morality would include an account of the nature of our evaluative judgments themselves and the evaluative concepts on which they rely, which Crowe takes for granted.

In deriving the principles of right action from the goodness facts, Crowe joins a long line of moral philosophers attracted to various forms of idealization as a route to practical insight (e.g., Williams 1979, Smith 1994, Markovits 2014). According to Crowe, facts about how one ought to behave are grounded in how one would conduct oneself under ideal conditions of full imaginative acquaintance with the basic goods. "Full imaginative acquaintance with a basic good would involve overcoming . . . barriers to imagine fullness or privation of the value in a variety of contexts" (p. 25). The process of idealization includes

reflecting on the ultimate ends that humans are disposed to value, considering the role of these goods in one's practical deliberations, extrapolating those deliberations to a range of other contexts, and considering what it would mean . . . to treat the good as valuable both for oneself and for others. (p. 124)

The proposal is appealing but invites questions which could be considered more carefully. Would full and vivid acquaintance with a wide range of goods -- friendship, pleasure, personal achievement, and so on -- result in intelligible behavior from which we can derive action-guiding principles? Crowe briefly considers worries about incommensurability but dismisses them on the grounds that ordinary ethical experience suggests the basic goods are commensurable: "people seem to weigh goods against each other . . . when deciding how to act" (p. 67). But the appeal to ordinary experience seems illegitimate by Crowe's own lights. Ordinary practical deliberation isn't informed by ideal imaginative reflection. On the contrary, it seems plausible that we are ordinarily able to choose between the goods precisely on account of our being highly selective and idiosyncratic samplers of the goods (cf. Johnston 2001).

More generally, Crowe seems to overlook the theory's skeptical implications. If the moral truths turn on complex empirical and counterfactual considerations, one might be tempted to suspend judgment on the true principles of right action. Crowe acknowledges that we're less than ideally placed to know the deliverances of ideal imaginative engagement with the basic goods, but suggests that one might look to community traditions and social norms for guidance because social norms "approximate imaginative immersion" by aggregating the normative experiences of a wide range of social agents over time (p. 125). That social norms do better than individual-level reflection at approximating ideal imaginative immersion is anything but obvious. One would have liked a more detailed account of how social norms emerge and reflect the normative experiences of agents.

Finally, defining ideal imaginative reflection solely in terms of what is good for humans seems arbitrary. Why shouldn't one take into account the perspective of non-human animals, who have normative inclinations just as humans do (cf. Korsgaard 2019)? The question is pressing given Crowe's arguments for a general duty to not interfere with others' engagement with the basic goods. Crowe argues that it is in the nature of finding basic goods valuable that one must see them as valuable for others, and having seen them in this proper light, one would be committed to not interfering with others' engagement with the goods (p. 64). I fail to see how having appreciated the general value of pleasure one could avoid seeing pleasure as valuable for non-human animals. To be fair, Crowe does not expressly rule out duties owed to other animals derived from idealized reflection. But passing over our obligations to animals in silence seems surprisingly out of step with the otherwise attractive ethical logic running through the book.

The moral determinants of legality

According to Crowe, what unites natural law views ("and differentiates them from legal positivism") is the idea that a rational or moral defect of a rule renders it either defective as law or else legally invalid (p. 138). "A poorly drafted, unjust or unreasonable standard will be legally defective, while an incomprehensible or deeply repugnant standard may be no law at all" (p. 181). Crowe explains that something counts as a law "only if (1) it is collectively accepted as a law by a social group with an appropriate concept of law incorporating its function (the acceptance condition) . . . and (2) it is constitutively capable of performing its function (the success condition)" (p. 180). Talk of functions can be obscure, but I take Crowe to be referring here to a purpose that is built into our concept of law. The function of law is to be "generally regarded by members of the community as conferring obligations" (p. 174). By analogy, something counts as a chair only if it is recognized as falling under the chair concept and is constitutively capable of meeting the function that defines our concept of a chair: to provide support.

The conceptual intuitions about law's artifactual nature and core function are vulnerable to challenge, but more worryingly: Crowe's natural law thesis does not follow from his claims about law's function. Unreasonable laws might be extremely effective at generating a sense of obligation in an unreasonable community. At points Crowe seems to recognize this: "The capacity of a standard to be generally viewed as binding will, however, depend on both the content of the standard and the nature of the community in question (emphasis mine)" (p. 176). But he does not engage with the implied conflict with natural law theory. If whether the moral defects of a rule count as legal defects depends on the nature of the community whose rule it is, the fundamental natural law thesis seems false: the moral defects of a rule are not necessarily legal defects.

In fact, if Crowe is right about law's function, the moral merits of a rule might be legal defects. Suppose morality turns out to be very demanding: under conditions of ideal imaginative engagement with the basic goods, we would devote most of our efforts towards mitigating the suffering of the worst-off. Perhaps very few benevolent beings are able to act as our ideal selves would. But then a rule's conformity with morality's true demands, by demanding extreme self-sacrifice, would disable it from attracting social compliance. It seems somewhat counterintuitive that a rule's moral merits could render it legally defective. If the concept of law provides a standard for evaluating the goodness of laws, one might have expected a law's compatibility with morality to be an intrinsically good-making feature. It is not, on Crowe's telling. One could complicate the account of law's function in response, but at the cost of even more controversial assumptions about our legal concept.

Notwithstanding these and other gaps in the arguments, the book makes an important contribution in developing metaethical foundations for natural law theory and by showing how the moral features of rules may contribute to their legality without being decisive. The latter point resonates with my own forthcoming article exploring the possibilities of a limited but nevertheless fundamental connection between the moral and legal facts. While I believe this connection is best motivated by appeal to its role in explaining a wide range of conflicting judgments about the legality of rules, I shall gladly turn to Crowe's analysis for added support, in particular, his account of law as a goodness-fixing kind. Crowe's book should be of interest to anyone in the market for a morally grounded theory of law that can seriously threaten positivist orthodoxy in legal philosophy.


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