Natural Moralities: A Defense of Pluralistic Relativism

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David B. Wong, Natural Moralities: A Defense of Pluralistic Relativism, Oxford University Press, 2006, 312pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195305395.

Reviewed by Christopher W. Gowans, Fordham University


Professor David Wong is one of the few philosophers who explicitly advocate a form of moral relativism. Natural Moralities develops and in some respects modifies his earlier defense of moral relativism in Moral Relativity (University of California Press, 1984). However, this description is misleading both because the form of relativism Wong defends is quite distinctive and rather different than what usually appears under that label, and because there is much more in the book than the concern with relativism would suggest. In particular, there is considerable discussion of the foundations of morality in human nature, the contributions of various sciences for understanding these foundations, the debate between liberals and communitarians, and Chinese philosophy mainly but not only in the Confucian tradition. Wong writes carefully and insightfully on a wide variety of topics. But the unifying theme is moral relativism, and this book makes a claim to being the most systematic and persuasive defense of moral relativism that has yet been written.

Wong defends what he calls "pluralistic relativism" (hereafter PR), the view that (a) "there is a plurality of true moralities," and (b) there are significant universal constraints, rooted in human nature and circumstances, on what can be a true morality (xii). Wong's acceptance of (a) means that he rejects the view that there is only one true morality (moral universalism) -- his primary target -- as well as the view that there is no true morality (moral nihilism). His affirmation of (b) has as a consequence that he does not think every existing morality is ipso facto a true one, thereby avoiding the common objection that relativism implies that the morality of any society, no matter how outrageous, is in some sense correct. His argument for PR, in Part I, is rather complex, and I can only give a brief summary here.

Wong begins with the phenomenon of "moral ambivalence." This occurs, to put it in the first person, when I am a party to a significant moral disagreement and recognize that the other party is nonetheless reasonable in holding the conflicting moral judgment such that my confidence in the "unique rightness" or "superiority" of my own judgment is "destabilized" or "shaken" (5). Wong believes this phenomenon is widespread, and he thinks it is important to properly interpret and explain it. His interpretation is that the moral disagreements that give rise to ambivalence typically involve a plurality of values such that the disagreeing parties accept the same values, but assign different priorities to them. This common ground is part of the reason I am able to see that the person with whom I disagree is reasonable. Hence, Wong takes moral ambivalence to presuppose moral value pluralism, the view that there is an irreducible "plurality of basic moral values" (6). Moreover, he argues in the first chapter that we should accept pluralism in this sense. (Thus, Wong defends two distinct kinds of pluralism: moral value pluralism and part (a) of PR.)

The next step in Wong's argument is that moral ambivalence, interpreted as implying moral value pluralism, should be explained in terms of "methodological naturalism." This emphasizes the importance of empirical inquiry, even for evaluating claims that purport to be a priori, and it recognizes no sharp line between epistemology and empirical sciences. Wong distinguishes this from forms of substantive naturalism. However, he takes methodological naturalism to make relevant the resources of psychology, anthropology, and evolutionary biology, and he argues that these resources provide evidence for substantive theses that have direct relevance for moral philosophy.

The most fundamental of these theses is his "functional conception of morality" according to which the function of morality is to promote and sustain social cooperation as well as individual flourishing (see 39-40 and 69). In addition, Wong thinks human beings by nature have basic propensities or interests that a morality must address if it is to fulfill these functions adequately. These include physical needs, social needs, needs for knowledge, etc. Wong also thinks we have by nature a range of motivations that extends from the more egoistic to the more altruistic (both are said to be products of natural selection). The depth and persistence of self-interest in the human psyche is a central theme of the book. On account of it, Wong argues that any adequate morality must include a norm of reciprocity that there be some form of fitting return of good for good: We cannot count on pure altruism. Wong has much to say in detail about the respects in which human nature, as well as human circumstances, as understood from his naturalistic standpoint, constrain the ways moralities can meet the two functions of morality stated above. But I have said enough to give an indication of the general shape of this aspect of his argument.

The final step in Wong's argument for PR is that it is the best explanation of moral ambivalence from his naturalistic perspective. On the one hand, he thinks, moral universalism cannot adequately explain ambivalence. For example, universalists typically and implausibly respond to ambivalence by denying moral value pluralism. On the other hand, PR provides a quite plausible explanation. Naturalistic constraints of the sort just noted make it likely that different moralities will and should have many common features, but these constraints are quite broad and so are insufficient to establish a single true morality. Hence, it is not surprising that there are many moral disagreements in which there is agreement on basic values but differences about which are more important (and more generally about how they are to be interpreted).  The result is moral ambivalence.

In Part II, Wong provides a more detailed account of the naturalistic constraints on an adequate morality. He argues that morality (including individual flourishing) requires "effective agency," that is, a "set of abilities that allow us to formulate reasonably clear priorities among our ends, and to plan and perform actions that have a reasonable chance of realizing our ends" (119). Effective agency depends in turn on having an "effective identity," that is, a practical identity that includes self-esteem, an ability to balance its different aspects, and a capacity to determine the implications of social norms. Wong argues that other persons, in particular early in life care-takers, "have a deep effect on the formation of our characters" (134), especially on the development and maintenance of effective identity and agency. The upshot is that an adequate morality must foster personal relations such as those in the family. As a result, the impersonal standpoint must be limited in some ways by the personal perspective, along with the partial duties to particular others that go with it.

On this basis, Wong sides with Confucians and Western communitarians who stress the importance of community and family, and he criticizes liberals such as John Rawls for not being able to account for this importance: "liberal morality must incorporate the value of community in order to promote the effective agency it needs to promote its own values" (150). However, he also thinks moral issues in the family require both a liberal conception of justice, focusing on individual rights, and a communitarian conception of justice, focusing on a common good. Each should inform the other. Moreover, the care perspective inaugurated by Carol Gilligan should inform and be informed by both. Each of these three perspectives provides important, but limited, moral insight into the family -- at least "in dominant moral traditions of the United States" (154).

A subsequent discussion also stresses the communitarian theme. Writing about distributive justice, Wong challenges the importance assigned to acquisitive motives by Thomas Nagel, and he suggests that Nagel's view is a bias of American culture that distorts the possibilities of human nature. Wong holds out the hope for what he calls "a communitarian commitment to strong equality." In this respect, he seems to think, communitarian values could provide a link from personal to impersonal concerns.

In the third and final part of the book, Wong addresses several issues concerning moral commitment that might be thought to arise from accepting PR. First, with respect to motivation in an adequate morality, he grants that an individual is not rationally required to be motivated by moral reasons, but he argues that, in view of his functional conception of morality, human beings in general must be capable of being motivated by its reasons -- otherwise it could not achieve its function. Hence, his position is externalist about individual motivation, while being internalist about human motivation. In addition, Wong maintains that some, though not all, forms of individual human flourishing involve commitment to morality. "Adequate moralities answer to and satisfy some central natural human propensities," Wong writes, and this provides "partial support for whatever confidence we have in our moral commitments" (219). In sum, Wong thinks that an adequate morality would provide a basis for motivation and flourishing for human beings on the whole, but not necessarily for each individual human being.

Finally, and most importantly for the relativist dimension of his position, Wong contends in his last chapter that a person can be fully committed to and engaged in a particular moral outlook while recognizing that other moral outlooks, in some respects incompatible, are also valuable. However, this recognition "can and often should have a deeper and wider effect on one's original moral commitments" (236). One of the main effects is that every adequate morality should include some form of the value of accommodation: we should strive for "peaceful co-existence between adherents of rival moral conceptions" (246; cf. 64). But Wong proposes much more than this. For example, when possible (and it is not always possible) we should try to learn from other moral perspectives, or to compromise with them, or to resolve differences in ways that preserve relationships, and so on and so forth. In effect, though he does not put it this way, these recommendations, or some of them, are Wong's attempt to recover the truth from the often-derided claim that relativism provides a basis for tolerance. For Wong, what we should say is that PR provides a basis for moral accommodation and other constructive responses to moral diversity.

Wong's arguments are rich and complex. They regularly draw on contemporary moral philosophy, the Confucian moral tradition, and the empirical sciences pertaining to human beings (in the last two cases, to a much greater extent than I have shown here). In many respects, Wong exhibits the value of accommodation he advocates. Though his work invites reflection on many fronts, I will be content here to raise some challenges for PR and his argument for it. First, it might be objected that moral ambivalence is not a widespread phenomenon. Though perhaps many persons are willing to say that those with whom they morally disagree may be reasonable, at least in some respects, rather few see in this acknowledgement a challenge to the unique correctness of their own position (except in unusual circumstances). Perhaps people should feel this way more than they do, and Wong gives examples intended to encourage intuitions supporting ambivalence. However, an argument for this normative claim is likely to draw on considerations similar to those that are put forward to show that PR is the best explanation of ambivalence. This suggests that ambivalence is better seen as a consequence of accepting PR than as a reason for accepting it. If we agree with PR, then we are more likely to feel moral ambivalence. However, there are not many persons who already feel ambivalence such that an explanation of the fact is required. Moreover, even among these persons, there may be other phenomena of moral experience that are best explained by a position other than PR: An explanation of ambivalence is surely not the only desideratum for a moral theory.

However, even if moral ambivalence is not widespread, this does not damage what I think should be seen as central in Wong's argument for PR. This is that empirical facts about human nature and circumstances both significantly limit and substantially underdetermine what could adequately fulfill the function of morality. If we accept these points, and Wong makes a powerful case for doing so, then we will have come a long way toward -- though not all the way to -- accepting both parts of PR: that there is more than one true morality and that there are universal constraints on what can be a true morality. The appeal to moral ambivalence is not necessary to see that these facts would render PR at least a plausible candidate for the correct meta-ethical position regarding moral truth (though PR might still explain ambivalence for those who feel it).

Of course, even if we agree with Wong about the general import of the empirical facts (that they both constrain and underdetermine), conclusions other than PR might still be drawn. On the one hand, those who give more emphasis to underdetermination may argue that we should give up all pretense of moral truth in the sense intended by Wong (that moral statements have truth conditions that depend on the moral norms accepted by a group, subject to the universal constraints). A noncognitivist might allow that there are some constraints on what could count as an adequate morality, and Wong has little to say about noncognitivist challenges to his position (for what he does say, see 72-3 and 79). He wants to keep moral truth, albeit relativist rather than realist moral truth, in the center of the picture.

On the other hand, those who attach more importance to the universal constraints might contend that we should make no concession to relativism, but should simply grant that general principles can properly have diverse results in practice. Many universalists allow that general principles can be interpreted and applied differently in different circumstances. This approach could make sense of much of the pluralism Wong wants without supposing that there is a plurality of true moralities. After all, a single morality could declare that a general principle A requires X in one circumstance and not-X in another, or that in some circumstances A permits either X or not-X. Wong discusses this line of objection in two contexts (sections 3.2 and 3.9). The most important part of his response is to insist on the importance of "local criteria" in addition to the universal constraints. These criteria are "expressions of the contingent value priorities that differentiate one morality from another" (80).

In effect, there is a sense in which Wong wants to preserve the moral autonomy, not of the individual, but of the group (in their emphasis on the importance of the group, relativists and communitarians are, at a minimum, natural allies). We are all subject to the universal constraints rooted in human nature and circumstances, but since these constraints underdetermine a specific moral outlook, choices have to be made to establish such an outlook. Who should make these choices? Wong thinks they need to be made primarily at the group level because an important function of morality is to promote social cooperation: The choices, or at least many of them, cannot be left to individuals or chaos will result (see 81). As a result, in contrast to universalism, moral truth depends on two factors: the universal constraints and the norms of a group. According to Wong, "the moral norms that emerge and get accepted within a group establish the truth conditions for moral statements as made by its members, but the truth conditions are subject to the universal constraints on adequate moralities that spring from human nature and the functions of morality" (71; cf. xiii).

There are complications that need to be taken into account here. Wong repeatedly speaks of the values of a group (and sometimes of a culture or tradition or society). However, as he well recognizes, there are often disagreements within a group; in particular, there are frequently those who dissent from a group's prevailing norms. For example, suppose there is a small number of Confucian families in a dominantly individualistic society such as the United States, and they think this society -- of which they are clearly a part -- should make different choices in some important respects (assume that both choices are consistent with the universal constraints). It might seem, from the passage just quoted, that the discrepant values of the Confucian families are mistaken. This would be problematic, in my judgment, because it gives dissenting members of a society insufficient reason to commit themselves to its values. At best, they may have a reason to go along; at worst, they may not have even this. Moreover, why should the fact that some of their values are out of step with the norms of the dominant group put those values into question? The need for social cooperation by itself does not establish that those values are wrong.

By way of amendment, we might say that the choices of a group are correct only if they are consistent with the universal constraints and various procedural requirements on the making of the choices have been met -- everyone is allowed to contribute to discussion, there is rule by majority, etc. (Wong does not make this move, but see 210-11). This might give dissenting members greater reason to agree to the group's values: though their view did not prevail, at least they were allowed to participate in the decision-making process. However, though this looks important, it is not enough. Such procedural approaches appear to sever the connection between the reasons people have for their values and the criterion of validity of the values: People do not ordinarily accept their values because they are the product of such a procedure.

In fact, however, Wong would not say that the Confucian families in my example are mistaken because, after all, they are also members of another group -- the Confucian tradition -- according to which their values are correct. But this raises a further question. These families belong to more than one group, and the values of these groups conflict in some important ways. Wong recognizes that many people belong in some significant respects to different groups, defined by a variety of parameters, often with different and sometimes with conflicting values, and that these groups relate to one another in an array of complex ways. The moral identity of many people is rooted in the fact that they identify with several distinct groups (traditions, cultures, etc.). What is needed, but not developed here, is an account of the truth conditions of the moral statements of people when the groups they belong to have conflicting moral values. The challenge for a relativist such as Wong is to take the complexities just noted seriously without slipping into something that verges on a subjectivism in which the moral statements of each individual, having a somewhat different configuration of group identifications, have different truth conditions -- something, I take it, Wong plainly wants to avoid. This account will also need to say something about the conditions under which a group's values are established, promulgated and regulated. Surely moral truth cannot be said to emerge from just any conditions, for example when coercion or oppression are obviously involved. Wong shows awareness of these issues, but more needs to be said to address them.

A final question concerns Wong's naturalism and the authority of the universal constraints. He argues that self-interest is a fundamental feature of human nature, alongside altruistic tendencies, that an adequate morality must respect -- hence the importance of the principle of good in return for good. In Mahayana Buddhism it is claimed that everyone can and should aspire to be a Bodhisattva, someone who seeks enlightenment not for his or her own sake but for the sake of all beings. The assumption is that everyone is capable of completely overcoming self-interest and attaining a purely altruistic standpoint. Though it is certainly acknowledged that this is quite difficult, it is maintained that each human being has the innate capacity to become a Bodhisattva via the disciplines summarized as the Six Perfections (generosity, morality, patience, effort, meditation and insight). The belief in this capacity is based on the conviction that the meditative disciplines reveal that we are deeply interconnected with one another -- we are not really distinct selves at all -- thereby undermining self-interest. In this sense, the naturalistic case for self-interest is acknowledged, but reinterpreted as representing a limited understanding of human nature. It is true that there are Buddhist moralities that involve forms of reciprocity. Nonetheless, the Bodhisattva ideal is fundamental in Mahayana Buddhism and expresses an interpretation of human capacities that is at odds with Wong's naturalist approach. At one point, he says that there may be legitimate approaches other than naturalism (see 36-7), but it is not clear what this admission implies. To insist that the empirical sciences are the only legitimate sources of knowledge of human nature is to embrace a "scientism" he says he wants to avoid. But if other interpretive approaches are permitted, then in some respects Wong's universal constraints may be challenged.

These misgivings should not detract from the fact that Professor Wong has written a work of major importance. Any future discussion of moral relativism, for or against, will need to take his arguments into account.