Natural Science

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Immanuel Kant, Natural Science, Eric Watkins (ed.), Lewis Beck, Jeffrey Edwards, Olaf Reinhardt, Martin Schönfeld, and Eric Watkins (trs.), Cambridge University Press, 2012, 818pp., $150.00 (hbk), 9780521363945.

Reviewed by Lydia Patton, Virginia Tech


Natural Science is a new volume of the Cambridge translations of Kant's works. It makes available some of the most significant texts of Kant's pre-Critical period, some appearing for the first time in English translation. The translations are largely clear and accurate. Eric Watkins is a sure and knowledgeable editor, and provides concise and informative introductions to each text. This volume is very welcome, as it lowers the bar significantly for students who do not read German.

The texts include the Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens, Thoughts on the Estimation of True Living Forces, lectures on Physical Geography, and shorter texts on earthquakes, fire, and natural history more generally. They reveal how carefully Kant read his predecessors and contemporaries in the natural sciences: Bernoulli, Euler, and Newton to be sure, but also de Buffon, Linnaeus, the Marquise de Châtelet, and many others. They also are a record of how an ambitious, young philosopher, trained in the Leibnizian school, responded to the most significant advances in natural science. Moreover, Kant's lectures and work on natural history, besides illuminating his reading of Buffon and others, has connections to his work throughout his career on ethics and on religion.

This volume will be a valuable resource and reference for researchers, and possibly a text in graduate seminars. However, if a student, or even a researcher relatively new to this topic, were looking to learn about the texts by reading straight through this work, she would not find it easy to do so. This is not in the least the fault of the editors and translators: the scholarly apparatus here is impressive and detailed. But these are difficult texts, and much depends on their historical context. For instance, the Universal Natural History and the Thoughts on the Estimation are both contributions to long-standing debates, and some aspects of these texts cannot be understood apart from those debates.

Nothing can replace trying to come to grips with Kant's texts directly. However, for these texts in particular, understanding Kant's positions requires knowing about, at a minimum, the vis viva debate (especially Leibniz's and Descartes's views), seventeenth and eighteenth century mechanism and dynamism, eighteenth century natural history, and the philosophical and cultural responses to the Lisbon earthquake of 1755. This review will thus partly focus on the merits of the text itself, including its translation and editing, but will also refer to other sources that illuminate this broader significance of Kant's texts.

A brief overview of some of the secondary literature may be helpful at this point. Erich Adickes's book Kant als Naturforscher is one of the earliest twentieth century appreciations of Kant's work on natural science. Lorenz Krüger and Wolfgang Carl, among others, have long emphasized the significance of Kant's scientific and pre-Critical work for his later philosophy. Martin Carrier has done sustained work on Kant's account of chemistry. Michael Friedman's Kant and the Exact Sciences traced the influence of Leibniz, Wolff, Newton, Euclid, and others on Kant's Critical and pre-Critical philosophy. KES, while not the first twentieth century work to address the natural scientific context of Kant's philosophy, ushered in a raft of new work on the subject in English-speaking philosophy. Alison Laywine, Eric Schliesser, Martin Schönfeld, Daniel Warren, and Eric Watkins, among many others, have contributed to our understanding of Kant's pre-Critical philosophy, of the scientific influences on that philosophy, and of the scientific work in which Kant himself was engaged. Recently, Michela Massimi has received a Leverhulme grant for work on Kant and the Laws of Nature, including, prominently, research on the work cited here. Massimi also has edited several special journal issues and books on the subject.

In the book's General Introduction, Watkins discusses what Kant took to be science. He touches on the vexed question of whether what Kant is doing in these texts consists of natural science, as we would now consider it, or of some branch of philosophy, metaphysics, or "natural philosophy." He raises, but gives no definitive answer to, the question of whether Kant did believe, as he said in the MFNS, that "in any special doctrine of nature there can be only as much proper science as there is mathematics therein" (Ak. 4:470, cited here xvi).

The introduction thus gives a principled or conceptual way to categorize the texts in the volume. Watkins does not give an overview of them, nor does he try to trace the development of Kant's thought over time. He leaves this for the introductions to the individual texts. In what follows, I will review several of the main texts in turn.

"Thoughts on the true estimation of living forces and assessment of the demonstrations that Leibniz and other scholars of mechanics have made use of in this controversial subject, together with some prefatory considerations pertaining to the force of bodies in general" (1746) Translated by Jeffrey B. Edwards and Martin Schönfeld.

This text (hereafter TTE) is intended as a contribution to the vis viva dispute between Leibniz and Descartes, the basis of which Watkins summarizes (pp. 1-3). Kant intends to resolve the dispute by advancing a rival position. As Watkins notes in the introduction, Kant fails to do so, but the text is a valuable indication of his views on the subject (p. 7).

The question at issue was how to evaluate the force of a moving body, including cases in which the body is affected by gravity or engages in collisions. Descartes argued that this force was best evaluated as f = mv (mass times velocity), also called vis mortua, dead force as it is translated here, or momentum, while Leibniz proposed vis viva, or living force as translated here, f = mv2. Descartes also argued that mv is conserved overall in the universe, which became a key issue in the dispute.

Papineau (1977) gives a sustained treatment of the controversy itself, arguing against an interpretation that the dispute centers on an equivocation on the word "force" (vis). This view, expressed by d'Alembert in the Traité de dynamique, is that the debate was a "war of words, too undignified to occupy the philosophers any longer" (d'Alembert 1743, xxi, trans. Papineau). That is to say, Descartes identified one type of force, correctly denoted mv, while Leibniz identified another, distinct type of force, correctly denoted mv2. As Hankins (1965) puts it, "Leibniz came close to stating the law of conservation of energy in mechanics while Descartes came close to stating the law of conservation of momentum" (p. 281).

Hankins and Papineau agree that the "war of words" description is inaccurate. Why would the best scientists of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries have put such significant effort into deciding a question that can be so easily brushed aside today by making a semantic distinction? Papineau's main argument is that there is more to the dispute, while Hankins points out that, following the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence, the Newtonians "joined the Cartesians in combating vis viva" (p. 282).

TTE is of significant interest, not only as Kant's first lengthy published work, but also as his response to an early clash between Newtonians and Leibnizians and as a valuable indication of the accounts in natural philosophy with which he engaged philosophically from early in his career. In addition, TTE marks one of Kant's earliest attempts to provide a philosophical resolution to a conflict in natural science.

The text itself is difficult and dense. Overall, Edwards and Schönfeld do a valiant job on the translation, which is the first to appear in English. I could quibble about some specific decisions about how to translate some passages. However, these are high-level decisions needed because there are ambiguities in the text. Anyone far enough along in their studies to be concerned with higher-level issues raised by the translation should be reading the text in the German in any event. The scholarly apparatus, especially footnotes, are plentiful and very helpful. TTE makes frequent reference to other views, not only the views of Descartes and Leibniz, but those of Bernoulli, the Marquise de Châtelet, Jean de Mairan, and others. Tracing the background to Kant's assertions takes work, which is made easier by the scholarly apparatus here. Nonetheless, a careful researcher would be well advised to consult resources on the vis viva debate and on Kant's responses to Cartesian and Leibnizian natural philosophy, which include Garber 1992, Laywine 1993, Schönfeld 2000, and Watkins 2001.

"The question of whether the Earth is ageing, considered from a physical point of view" (1754). Translated by Olaf Reinhardt.

This text has received comparatively little attention from scholars, with the exception of some recent works including that of Ferrini (2004). There are at least two contexts in which it may prove illuminating.

The first is as Kant's early commentary on the progress of seventeenth and eighteenth century natural history, including the debate between Cuvier, Hutton, and de Buffon over catastrophism versus uniformitarianism. This debate centered on whether the earth's progress through time followed uniform laws throughout, or whether catastrophic events in the earth's past altered the laws and principles that govern its development and fate.

Second, it is an early attempt by Kant to evaluate natural history, and the life sciences in general, in the light of metaphysical principles. It is thus tempting to read the views of the Critique of Judgment back into this work, which would be a mistake. However, Kant's remarks on how to weigh the available evidence, and how this evidence bears on larger questions like the titular one, show a similarity of method that appears to have endured.

"Universal natural history and theory of the heavens" (1755). Translated by Olaf Reinhardt.

This ambitious and wide-ranging work was intended to put Kant on the intellectual map. Unfortunately, as Watkins explains, Kant's publisher went under, and the copies of the book were impounded. Nonetheless, the work went on to have a modest influence later in Kant's career. Given Kant's subsequent stature, of course, the work is of interest as an indication of his early views.

The UNH is a topic of contemporary research for other reasons. It incorporates theological and philosophical reflections on the origins and development of the universe. Also, it contains perhaps Kant's most significant argument in natural science proper: a statement, in Part Two Chapter One, of the nebular hypothesis about the origin of the universe and its heavenly bodies. Moreover, Kant here gives an evaluation of what he refers to as the "mechanical" and "dynamical" worldviews. That is to say, he gives some analysis of the difference between the view according to which all that exists is matter and motion, versus the view according to which forces are real properties of bodies. This is a continuation and development of a line of argument in TTE, and constitutes a significant theme in the pre-Critical work (see, among others, Massimi 2011). Given this, it is excellent that this solid and clear new translation by Olaf Reinhardt is now available.

"Earthquakes" (1756). Translated by Olaf Reinhardt.

In 1755, a catastrophic earthquake decimated Lisbon, Portugal. The earthquake was a blow to those who argued for a rational, divine purpose and organization to the universe: what was the purpose for such rampant devastation? Many Enlightenment philosophers were not willing to follow (some) religious leaders, who attributed the earthquake to the sin of the Lisboans. Voltaire famously refers to the earthquake in Candide as an argument against Leibniz's hypothesis that this is the best of all possible worlds. Rousseau and Lessing also weighed in, along with many lesser-known figures. Kant's contributions to the debate (chapters 6-8) take a middle position. According to him the earthquakes can be given an entirely natural, mechanical explanation, but, he argues, this ought not shake our faith in the rational governance of the universe according to natural law.

"Physical geography" (1802). Translated by Olaf Reinhardt.

Kant did not publish this himself . Rather, these are lecture notes transcribed by others, and thus, like the lectures on metaphysics, logic, and anthropology, should be read with this in mind.

I will forgo a lengthy summary of this wide-ranging collection of lectures. Instead, I would refer the reader to a collection of essays on the significance and interest of Kant's work in this area, (Elden and Mendieta (2011)). One of the essays is by Olaf Reinhardt, and provides interesting and suggestive notes on difficulties of translating these texts (see especially p. 107).


It is the right time for a collection like this to appear. An increasing number of scholars are interested in the topics in these texts, and in coming to grips with the history and context of the views Kant expresses in his works on natural science in the pre-Critical period. Moreover, recent scholarship has identified a number of philosophically intriguing questions stimulated by the texts. The translations found here should help acquaint a new generation of scholars with the texts, their context, and their significance.


Adickes, Erich. 1924-5. Kant als Naturforscher, 2 vols. Berlin: De Gruyter.

Carl, Wolfgang. 1989. Der schweigende Kant. Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.

D'Alembert, Jean le Rond. 1743. Traité de dynamique. Paris.

Elden, Stuart and Mendieta, Eduardo, eds. 2011. Reading Kant's Geography. Contemporary Continental Philosophy Series. New York: SUNY Press.

Ferrini, Cinzia, ed. 2004. Eredità Kantiane. Napoli: Bibliopolis.

Friedman, Michael. 1992. Kant and the Exact Sciences. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Garber, Dan. 1992. Descartes' Metaphysical Physics. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Hankins, Thomas. 1965. "Eighteenth Century Attempts to Resolve the Vis viva Controversy," Isis 56 (3): 281-297.

Laywine, Alison. 1993. Kant's Early Metaphysics and the Origins of the Critical Philosophy. Atascadero: Ridgeview Publishing.

Lefèvre, Wolfgang, and Wunderlich, Falk. 2000. Kants naturtheoretische Begriffe (1747-1780), Berlin: De Gruyter.

Massimi, Michela. 2011. "Kant's dynamical theory of matter in 1755, and its debt to speculative Newtonian experimentalism," Studies in history and philosophy of science 42 (4): 525-543.

Papineau, David. 1977. "The Vis Viva Controversy: Do Meanings Matter?" Studies in the history and philosophy of science 8 (2): 111-141.

Reinhardt, Olaf. 2011. "Translating Kant's Physical Geography," pp. 103-114 in Elden and Mendieta.

Schliesser, Eric. Forthcoming. "On Reading Newton as An Epicurean," Studies in history and philosophy of science.

Schönfeld, Martin. 2000. The Philosophy of the Young Kant. New York: Oxford University Press.

Warren, Daniel. 2010. "Kant on attractive and repulsive force: The balancing argument," pp. 193-241 in Mary Domski and Michael Dickson, eds., Discourse on a new method. Chicago: Open Court.

Watkins, Eric, ed. 2001. Kant and the Sciences, New York: Oxford University Press.

Watkins, Eric. 2001. "Kant on Force and Extension" pp. 111-127 in Between Leibniz, Newton and Kant, Wolfgang Lefevre, ed., Dordrecht: Kluwer.