Natural Signs and Knowledge of God: A New Look at Theistic Arguments

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C. Stephen Evans, Natural Signs and Knowledge of God: A New Look at Theistic Arguments, Oxford University Press, 2012, 220pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199661077.

Reviewed by Mark Wynn, University of Leeds


In this book, C. Stephen Evans examines and defends the idea that certain features of the world and certain mental states can serve as 'natural signs' of God. Evans is particularly interested in four such signs: beneficial order in nature, the fundamental value of human persons, cosmic wonder, and the experience of moral obligation. His usage of the expression 'natural sign' is patterned on Thomas Reid's proposal that sensations serve as 'natural signs' of the objects of perceptual experience (pp. 28-29). Summarising Reid's approach, Evans comments: 'The key idea is that sensations are not normally themselves the objects of perception, but are the means by which we perceive other things' (p. 31). On this Reidean account, sensations give us direct, non-inferential access to the objects of perception. And Evans wonders whether certain features of the world, or of our own experience, might not function similarly to reveal God's reality, and in some measure God's nature, independently of any inference. Evans notes that the Reidean and theistic cases may not be exactly parallel since, depending on our preferred usage, a sign-mediated revelation of God's reality may not count as 'experiencing God' (p. 182).

Evans argues that if there is a God of the kind depicted in the major monotheistic traditions, then we should expect that God to seek to draw human beings into a relationship with himself, while respecting their freedom. Putting together these considerations, he suggests that we should expect such a God to provide 'natural signs' of his reality, so that all, or nearly all, human beings have the opportunity to learn that there is a God, while ensuring that these signs can be obscured or overridden relatively easily. Accordingly, Evans supposes that, assuming there is a God, we should expect there to be natural signs of God's reality which satisfy both the 'wide accessibility principle' (WAP) and the 'easy resistibility principle' (ERP) (pp. 13-17). From this perspective, the growing consensus among cognitive scientists that belief in God, or the gods, is 'hard-wired' in human beings (pp. 39-41, 155-156) provides a measure of support for theism, since theism is committed to WAP, and therefore predicts that a susceptibility to theistic belief will be universal in human cultures.

Of course, religious believers have taken many features of the world as 'natural signs' in this sense. Evans has chosen to concentrate on cosmic wonder and the other cases I have noted because these signs have provided the basis for various theistic arguments. The cosmological argument, for example, takes as its premise the claim that individual material things, or the material order in its entirety, might not have existed. And on Evans' account, we can see this premise as an attempt to cast in discursive form an insight which is given to us more immediately in the experience of cosmic wonder. Similarly, Evans suggests, we might take the claim defended in the design argument, that beneficial order is evidence of design, as an attempt to spell out in inferential terms an insight which is given to us more directly in the experience of beneficial order. And lastly, the various moral arguments for the existence of God can similarly be read as discursive formulations of what many of us believe in the first instance non-inferentially on the basis of the relevant natural signs.

Evans suggests that associating the traditional arguments for the existence of God with the idea that cosmic wonder, beneficial order, and so on, can function as natural signs of God's reality can help to explain both the enduring appeal of these arguments, and the fact that none of them constitutes a proof of the existence of God. For instance, he remarks of the relatively modest conclusion of Richard Swinburne's version of the Cosmological Argument:

If we think of the argument as resting on a natural sign, taking into account both the Wide Accessibility Principle and the Easy Resistibility Principle, then something like Swinburne's conclusion is exactly what we would expect. The sign that lies at the base of the argument, since it points to God's reality, would make it appear more likely, at least to many people, that God exists. However, given the fact that the sign is resistible, one would not expect that even the probability that God exists could be definitely fixed as high (p. 59).

The book's subtitle promises a 'new look' at theistic arguments, and this attempt to use the idea that these arguments are based on signs to assess the prospects of their success does indeed represent a novel perspective on their character. In support of this general approach, Evans cites Hume and Kant, both of whom were, famously, critical of the theistic arguments, while at the same time acknowledging the enduring 'pull' of the case they present.

Evans also defends this judgement about the real but limited effectiveness of the theistic proofs by reviewing a range of cosmological, design, and moral arguments for the existence of God. This discussion occupies chapters 3 to 5, and for each family of arguments, Evans concludes that the case is suggestive but not coercive. Chapter 1 sets the scene for this discussion, by noting how the major themes of the book provide a way of bringing together traditional natural theology, and its appeal to the theistic 'proofs', and the perspective of 'reformed epistemology', and its claim that belief in God can be 'grounded' non-inferentially in our experience of the world, or our moral experience, so that it counts as 'properly basic'. Evans' reconciliatory strategy could be understood as a generalisation of his assessment of Swinburne's version of the Cosmological Argument: in brief, if we follow the reformed epistemologists in taking cosmic wonder, and so on, as 'grounds' for belief, then we have some reason to suppose that the traditional arguments, in so far as they take these 'signs' as premises, will exercise an enduring 'appeal' (p.3), even if they fall short of proving their conclusions.

In chapter 6, Evans draws his case to a close, arguing that the 'natural signs' for God reviewed in the book provide some reason, not necessarily an all things considered reason, for supposing that there is a God (p. 172). The author's case here depends on his endorsement of something like Swinburne's 'principle of credulity', if the question of justification is framed in internalist terms (p. 181), or something close to Alvin Plantinga's thought that if theism is true, then it is also likely to be warranted, if the question is posed in externalist terms (pp. 177-178). But on Evans' account, theistic signs remain easily resistible when compared with, say, Reidean natural signs. Evans also returns at this point to a further strand of his project of reconciling natural theological and reformed theological perspectives, by noting that the success of the traditional 'proofs' need not make 'revelation' redundant. These proofs, and the associated signs, provide after all only a very sketchy idea of the divine nature; their role for Evans is in part to challenge the adequacy of a naturalist world-view, so paving the way for an argument for the trustworthiness of 'revelation'.

There is, I take it, no great novelty in the idea that the traditional proofs are based on experiences which many people find religiously suggestive independently of any attempt to cast their import in argumentative form. The great merit of Evans' book is to take this idea and to subject it to close scrutiny. I cannot think of another work which gives such sustained attention to the thought that the traditional proofs are to be read in these terms. And Evans' proposal that if we construe the proofs in this way, then we have a new vantage point on their prospects for success is, I think, a genuinely original thought which deserves serious investigation. Moreover, the author's discussion of particular proofs is full of interest: even experienced students of these matters will find his handling of the arguments consistently engaging and instructive.

What should we make of this case? If we grant that the 'principle of credulity' applies in this sphere, albeit subject to ERP, then theistic natural signs will provide a prima facie reason for supposing that there is a God, independently of any attempt to cast their import in argumentative form. The person who doubts whether these signs are to be read in this way will need, then, to shoulder the burden of producing countervailing considerations. Let's consider one such response.

Undoubtedly many people have taken the beneficial order exhibited by living things as a natural sign of design. But historically, in the eighteenth century for example, this reading of the world seems to have been infused by the thought that such order must be 'directly' the product of design. (Contrast the case of 'indirect' design, where the order of living things originates from some law-governed process, which is in turn designed.) Here, the sign functions as a sign, it is taken to point towards design, not by way of brute psychological association, but because the recipient of the sign takes herself to see (independently of any inference) that the ordering of the parts of creatures must have arisen in this way. It was, I take it, because the sign had this particular content in the eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries that Darwinian considerations were thought to have undermined it. So here is one case where the epistemic force of an Evansian natural sign appears to be challenged by developments in our knowledge of the world.

Evans responds to the Darwinian critique of the design argument by suggesting that the argument can be re-cast in a plausible, post-Darwinian form. It may be that the order evident in the bodies of living things derives from evolutionary processes, but these processes depend in turn on the operation of fundamental laws; this picture 'does not imply that the original beneficial order [the order of living things] is an illusion or that it does not point to design. Rather, it might seem to point to a designer who is more ingenious than one might have suspected from observing that initial order.' (p. 87) Perhaps this elaboration of the argument can meet the Darwinian critique. But this version of the argument is focused upon temporal regularity, rather than the spatial regularity that is evident in the bodies of living things. And if there is a natural sign corresponding to this version of the argument, its content will be rather different, presumably, from that of the eighteenth century natural sign. Alternatively, it might be argued that spatial regularity can continue to be read as a natural sign, once we see that apparently rebutting Darwinian considerations can themselves be rebutted. However, the sign's capacity to function as a sign will then depend upon its being inserted within a natural theological framework, with the consequence that it can no longer succeed as a sign independently of inference and argument.

As it happens, I think that Evans misrepresents William Paley's version of the argument from design. Paley argues not that we know that watches are designed because we have seen them being designed, and that the universe or objects within it are watch-like, and so are likely to be designed too. He argues, rather, that even if we had no knowledge that watches were made by human beings, we could infer that a watch was designed, because such a finely-tuned purpose-serving structure could not have originated from any non-purposive process. (Contrast Evans' summary of his case: 'We have observed countless human artifacts that we know to be the work of design. . . . Since like effects come from like causes, if human artifacts are the work of intelligent design, this suggests that the same is true for many objects or systems found in nature.' (p78))

So the appeal to signs may need to be supported by natural theological arguments if apparent defeaters of signs are themselves to be defeated. And if there are many such defeaters, then the believer's trust in signs will need to be buttressed by extensive reliance on natural theological considerations. I think Evans would be reluctant to give natural theology such a large role. This may reflect his reading of the significance of ERP. He comments: 'Given the constraint of the Easy Resistibility Principle on signs, it will always be possible for a critic to find some possible way that the argument might fail' (p. 64). So given ERP, we might suppose that we can to some extent explain away apparent defeaters to signs (and the theistic arguments which derive from them) in so far as ERP leads us to expect that there will be such defeaters, even if theism is true. But presumably some apparent defeaters will pose a serious enough challenge to require an argued rebuttal, if continued trust of the sign is to be rationally appropriate, and, in this spirit, Evans offers counter-arguments to a number of potential defeaters of signs.

Natural theological arguments may also have a role to play in sustaining the premises of the traditional proofs. Evans is inclined to say that these premises depend for their plausibility upon the epistemic pull of the relevant natural sign, and for that reason can be no more plausible than the corresponding sign. See for example his gloss on Swinburne's comment that a complex universe calls for explanation:

Perhaps the recognition that the universe is puzzling or mysterious is something that human beings can immediately perceive, and the claim that it is such factors as complexity and particularity that are the basis of this puzzling, mysterious character is more the result of reflection that tries to understand the perception than the premise of an argument. (p. 61)

But this may be a little quick, since Swinburne is arguing that complexity requires explanation. And if this and other such arguments have some force, then perhaps natural theological considerations can help to secure the premises of the traditional 'proofs' to some extent independently of signs, so that their epistemic weight can be added to that of the relevant sign. If Evans is right, ERP would set a limit on the plausibility of such a proof. But natural theological considerations would then make the premises, and in turn the conclusions, of the argument more plausible than they would otherwise be.

So in these ways, natural theology may have a larger role to play than is suggested by the drift of Evans' account: it may be that trust in theistic signs requires (at least for those who have the requisite education) fairly extensive reliance on natural theological rebuttals of potential defeaters of those signs. Furthermore, it may be that natural theology can play an important part in shoring up the premises of the traditional proofs, insofar as those premises are not just reformulations of an insight that is conveyed in the correlative sign but are capable of being supported by argument. This perspective is very much consonant with the spirit of Evans' reconciliatory project -- though we might think that this is more a case of natural theology coming to the aid of reformed epistemology, rather than vice versa.