Naturalism and Normativity

Placeholder book cover

Mario De Caro and David Macarthur (eds.), Naturalism and Normativity, Columbia University Press, 2010, 368pp., $29.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231134675.

Reviewed by Benedict Smith, Durham University


This book follows an earlier volume edited by Macarthur and De Caro, Naturalism in Question (Harvard University Press, 2004), and Naturalism and Normativity contains chapters by many of the same authors. The contributors are philosophers whose work constitutes influential expressions of different forms of contemporary naturalism. Overall, the volume raises numerous questions about orthodox naturalism and articulates and discusses the different positions gathered under the banner of 'Liberal Naturalism'. De Caro and Macarthur present the essays contained in this volume "as contributions to a fruitful controversy that we want to recommend to the reader's attention" (p. 9). It is a timely book that is an excellent resource for anyone interested in the relation between naturalism and normativity, as well as those interested in the future prospects of naturalism.

There are 16 chapters overall, divided into six parts:

I: 'Conceptual and Historical Background' (chapters by Akeel Bilgrami, Richard Rorty, and Mario De Caro and Alberto Voltolini);

II: 'Philosophy and the Natural Sciences' (Hilary Putnam, Carol Rovane);

III: 'Philosophy and the Human Sciences' (David Macarthur, Peter Menzies);

IV: 'Meta-ethics and Normativity' (T. M. Scanlon, Erin I. Kelly and Lionel K. McPherson, Stephen L. White);

V: 'Epistemology and Normativity' (Huw Price, Richard Rorty and Huw Price, Paul Redding);

VI: 'Naturalism and Human Nature' (John Dupré, Peter Godfrey-Smith, Marie McGinn).

The chapters by Rorty, Price and Scanlon have been previously published (although Rorty's piece was originally written for this volume). The book also contains (Part V) a debate between Rorty and Price on neo-pragmatist accounts of truth, which selects material from 2003-2008.

One principal objective of the volume is to provide a platform for the articulation of Liberal Naturalism -- the contemporary label for the kind of naturalism inspired, amongst others, by Price and John McDowell. Although Liberal Naturalism incorporates a range of views, a central tenet is that there is more to what is natural, and more to how we can investigate it, than Scientific Naturalism could allow. The "serious metaphysics" which underpins orthodox naturalism operates by either 'eliminating or locating' normative features of the world, as Frank Jackson puts it.[1] Roughly speaking, once Scientific Naturalism has been 'liberalized' it can accommodate a broader range of entities and ways of understanding. Both Scientific and Liberal versions of naturalism reject supernatural entities (spirits, Cartesian minds) and supernatural faculties of knowing (mystical insight, spiritual intuition), but adopt different stances toward normativity -- specifically about how and where to 'locate' normativity with regard to the natural world. This, the 'placement problem', poses a challenge to conventional forms of naturalism since the scientific image of the world ultimately has no place for normative phenomena. De Caro and Macarthur explain that the placement problem is apparently intractable for the scientific naturalist orthodoxy.

A convincing version of Liberal Naturalism would need to do justice to the range and diversity of the sciences, including the human and social sciences, and to the plurality of ways of understanding, including the possibility that some of these ways are non-scientific yet non-supernatural (p. 9). As the editors explain, Liberal Naturalism is not a precise doctrine but a range of attempts to account for core normative phenomena in ways that do not breach naturalistic constraints, once these have been appropriately liberalized.

There is not space here to engage with all the chapters since, as one would expect in a book on 'naturalism and normativity', the content is extremely wide-ranging. There are elements that I do not explicitly consider here which include discussions of scientific realism and relativism (Rovane); Scientific Naturalism, the human sciences and rationality (Macarthur); naturalism and philosophical psychology (Menzies); and the relation between Dewey and McDowell (Godfrey-Smith). All the chapters are worth reading individually and, taken collectively, provide a rich platform for future work on a variety of topics. There are some overarching themes that the book succeeds in bringing to the fore.

A merit of this book is that readers can get an idea of the historical nature of the debate over naturalism and normativity. This is important not simply because historical considerations are helpful by way of scene setting for the contemporary issues. Connected to the ontological breadth of what Liberal Naturalism can accommodate -- 'controversial normative entities' such as reasons and values -- is a historical depth; providing an account of normative phenomena needs to appreciate how historical dimensions are constitutively part of the structures of normativity and the character of our thought. Redding's chapter, for instance, provides an engaging discussion of the influence of German Idealism on contemporary debates over naturalism and how the work of Bernard Williams and neo-Hegelians such as Robert Brandom contributes to how we understand our "present normative orientations" in relation to earlier forms from which they arose (p. 278).

Bilgrami emphasises how the irreducibly normative relations between subjectivity and the world are shaped by a "history and tradition" which form the contexts in which perceptions of value and the demands those values make on us can exist. His chapter discusses the importance of the context within which the human subject is responsive to normative properties in the world. For Bilgrami, failure to recognize the normative character of the world implies that the only 'place' for normativity left, if anywhere, is within the subject: "The human subject is supposed to be enchanted wholly from within." (p. 31). It is an important aspect of the book that it includes discussion of these issues, since the historical character of human subjectivity has significant implications for the status of naturalist approaches in philosophy.

Rorty's contribution is also relevant to the historical dimension of normativity. He suggests giving up the visual metaphors of various 'images' of the world -- Sellars's manifest and scientific images, say. Furthermore, we ought to reject the way of doing philosophy that promotes a "world-picture picture" and, rather than seek a synoptic vision of the world, we need, at most, a "synoptic narrative" that articulates how our human practices came to be the way they are (p. 58). Rather than taking on "great big things like Experience, or Language" (p. 66), philosophers ought to have conversations with anthropologists and historians and others who can help illuminate the narratives about how we have developed (p. 61). None of this, Rorty thinks, is helped by trying to show how the achievements of humanity are linked to the movement of particles. The approaches adopted by historians, say, ought to be of a piece with philosophical investigation. This has implications not just for how philosophy, naturalism and normativity are considered vis-à-vis each other, but how philosophy is related to other forms of inquiry. In addition, as Putnam suggests in his chapter, the characterizations of human life offered in the novels of Tolstoy and George Elliot can be directly involved in helping us to understand aspects of our lives (p. 97). If this is right, then forms of inquiry, including philosophy, are engaged in something more than explanation if narrowly understood in terms of Scientific Naturalism.

According to De Caro and Macarthur: "A necessary condition for a view's being a version of Liberal Naturalism is that it rejects Scientific Naturalism, hence it rejects the ontological doctrine or the methodological doctrine, or both" (p. 9). The point is that these 'doctrines' are described in ways that exhaust the relevant subject-matter. Ontologically, Scientific Naturalism says that the world contains nothing but what scientific explanations commit us to. Methodologically, Scientific Naturalism privileges scientific inquiry as providing the only genuine source of knowledge or understanding (p. 4). Nevertheless, once liberalized, a subsequent naturalism need not constitute a rejection of some core commitments of Scientific Naturalism; presumably, a Liberal Naturalist does not want to reject the idea that scientific inquiry is about natural entities, or that an appropriate way to inquire into what there is, is by utilizing the methods developed by the natural sciences. A key claim is that orthodox naturalism is restrictive; it excludes a range of phenomena and ways of finding out about the world and ourselves, and it does so unjustifiably. Liberalizing orthodox naturalism involves removing these restrictions. Scientific Naturalism provides an impoverished view if construed as exhaustive of what there is and how we might come to know about what there is. Understood as extending rather than as opposing Scientific Naturalism, Liberal Naturalism is thus conceived as more 'expansive' -- both ontologically and methodologically.

Thus, a clear theme of the volume overall is the value placed on ontological and methodological pluralism. In different ways, many of the chapters suggest how liberalized naturalism can accommodate those "controversial entities" (moral, phenomenological, intentional entities) discussed in the book. The contributions by Rorty, Putnam and Dupré, for instance, stress how we need a variety of ways of investigating the world and ourselves. Dupré's "committed naturalism", for example, suggests that otherwise investigation would be hindered because of being committed to the existence of and search for a single authoritative perspective (p. 301). The value of Liberal Naturalism is that it can help show (or remind) us that the diversity of human experience is in large part that to which philosophical theorizing is answerable -- itself a kind of normative relation. There need be no a priori requirement that a one-dimensional explanatory account or perspective is ultimately privileged as such.

A limitation of the volume, although somewhat inevitable, is that in-depth discussion of the varieties of normativity is eclipsed by a focus on questions about naturalism. Consideration of the varieties of normativity is, of course, implicit in characterizing the alternative forms of naturalism discussed in this book, and it would not be possible in one volume to do justice to the complexities of normativity as well. The editors' Introduction has an epigraph taken from Putnam -- "normativity is ubiquitous". Even if this is right, we should not infer from it that 'normativity is uniform' -- it may be everywhere but it is not everywhere the same. I'm not suggesting that De Caro and Macarthur or any Liberal Naturalist regards normativity as uniform, but taking the sort of pluralism discussed in the book seriously would also mean being sensitive to the varieties of normativity. De Caro and Macarthur explain that the ubiquity of normativity implies that "it has some claim to being the central area for which philosophy must provide an account if we are to achieve the sort of self-understanding that Socrates, and many other philosophers since, have promised us" (p. 9). Of course, regarding the normative to be ubiquitous can perfectly well accommodate -- and indeed emphasize -- the fact that there is a variety of normativity; looking carefully and adequately characterizing this variety would be a very important philosophical task, the value of which is suggested by the contributions to this book.

The volume includes an interesting chapter by McGinn who discusses Wittgenstein's distinctive naturalism. This is interpreted as favouring description over explanation, emphasizing how characterizing aspects of our lives and responsiveness to meaning should take precedence over trying to explain them (p. 347). In providing explanations, we do not thereby adopt a less controversial because less normative vocabulary or discourse. In giving explanations we nevertheless use language "full-blown", according to Wittgenstein.[2] The elucidatory character of Liberal Naturalism is expressed by White's chapter on moral phenomenology and is implicit in Kelly and Macpherson's discussion of moral naturalism which, in its conventional mode, "shifts questions of justification heavily in the direction of explanation" (p. 193). There is no reason to shun attempts at explanation as such. There are various kinds of explanation, including 'vindicatory explanation' -- something that is not discussed in the book.[3] The point emphasized by this aspect of the volume is that philosophical reflection on normativity need not just have explanation as its goal or be forced into solely trying to identify the relevant explanatory hierarchies.

In this context, Rorty's view is sometimes expressed in terms of the idea that "no kind of thing is more fundamental than any other kind of thing." (p. 64). This should not be ontologically or methodologically troubling. One might think that this jeopardizes the possibility of assessing rival synoptic narratives, until a replacement standard or set of standards is offered in virtue of which we can tell how one is superior to another. A plethora of such standards are available and actively shape our lives everyday. A mistake of Scientific Naturalism is to assume that the normativity governing thought and action in any local or particular case is explicable in terms of more general and less contextual standards. What we learn from this book is that forms of Liberal Naturalism are not simply suspicious of the attempt to understand phenomena in light of larger contexts, it is rather that getting clear about the nature of those contexts is vital. We can't understand the meanings and norms that structure interpersonal relations, say, by looking at the movement of particles -- that is clearly an inadequate place to look. The challenge is to allow for there being many ways that normativity figures in our lives and to provide an account that is recognizable as a form of naturalism. Furthermore, the naturalism may also be revisionary. Therapeutic or quietist naturalism, since it is 'relaxed', is not somehow opposed to the development of philosophical understanding. It is a distinctive view about what that development consists in. It is notable that some of the themes that emerge from this volume attest to the normative character of Liberal Naturalism itself.

Putnam's chapter urges us to preserve both the 'moral face' of philosophy (the one that invites us to interrogate our lives and cultures and challenges us to reform them) and the 'theoretical face' of philosophy (the one that asks us to clarify what we think and know and to work out how it all 'hangs together' in Sellars's sense). To renounce either "is not just to kill the subject of philosophy; it is to commit intellectual and spiritual suicide" (p. 94). This is one amongst other examples in the book of how the value of philosophy and of Liberal Naturalism are emphasized and made pertinent to wider questions about humanity and responsibility. In earlier statements of his version of Liberal Naturalism, McDowell suggests that picturing the natural world as an "ineffable lump" does not express a superior metaphysical insight into the true nature of reality. The kind of impersonal stance required by scientific understanding should not be privileged as such over other, more engaged ways of understanding. A "dehumanized stance" is one way of finding out about the world amongst others. McDowell writes of a "wish to avoid responsibility" that can accompany the character of orthodox naturalism -- we cannot be blamed for thinking and acting in the ways we do if, really, our thoughts and deeds are ultimately the product of meaningless forces.[4] Yet, as the different contributions explain in a number of places, a humanized stance is not only compatible with but can be constitutively part of a naturalist approach.

A version of Liberal naturalism would, in the words of De Caro and Macarthur, inhabit the conceptual space between Scientific Naturalism and Supernaturalism (p. 9). It could also draw together the moral and theoretical faces of philosophy. In addition, Putnam urges respect for ordinary language; the normativity embodied in such discourse itself provides a constraint on philosophical theories. If ordinary language is viewed as simply an object for philosophical inquiry, and one that needs to be analyzed into something more basic and less controversial, then "philosophical theories are no longer held responsible at all to the ways in which we actually speak and actually live" (p. 97).

De Caro and Macarthur explain that:

One of the primary motivations for the present volume is the thought that the debate over which form of naturalism is best will depend to a considerable extent on which provides the best account of core normative phenomena such as reasons and values (p. 9).

Those participating in this debate have divergent conceptions of what an acceptable account would look like, not only in terms of what entities make it in to such an account, or of which sources of knowledge are acceptable, but also about what accounting for amounts to. A Wittgensteinian naturalism, as articulated in McGinn's chapter, emphasizes the importance of descriptions or characterizations of relevant aspects of our lives. This suggests that the implications of liberalized naturalism are very far reaching, since it may require a re-evaluation of the ways in which philosophical inquiry is articulated.

Hume's philosophy still exerts a very powerful influence in a number of areas and he was, according to McDowell, "the prophet par excellence" of a disenchanted conception of the world.[5] Yet, Hume urged his own pluralist characterization of human life and, therefore, a conception of philosophical inquiry that was answerable to this diversity. Whilst science expresses and 'nourishes man's rational side', we are social no less then rational; human beings need friends and families, work and play, and much else too of course. As Hume puts it: "nature has pointed out a mixed kind of life most suitable to human race … ume says,Hhhhh Indulge your passion for science, says she, but let your science be human".[6] This book succeeds in bringing out how different forms of naturalism can cooperate in ways that are mutually enhancing and need not simply be opposed to one another. Even the 'naturalist' Hume recognized that. Thus in terms of the editors' stated aims, this book is certainly a valuable 'contribution to a fruitful controversy' and will help shape how the relation between naturalism and normativity can be understood and developed.

[1] Frank Jackson, From Metaphysics to Ethics: A Defence of Conceptual Analysis, Oxford University Press, 1998, p. 5.

[2] Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, Blackwell, 1967, §120.

[3] See David Wiggins, 'Moral Cognitivism, Moral Relativism and Motivating Moral Beliefs', Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 1990-91, Vol. 91, pp. 61-85.

[4] John McDowell, 'Two Sorts of Naturalism' in his Mind, Value and Reality, Harvard University Press, 1998, pp. 167-197.

[5] John McDowell, Op. cit., p. 174.

[6] David Hume, An Enquiry into Human Understanding, Oxford University Press, 1975, p. 9.